The Spiritual Automaton: Spinoza's Science of the Mind

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Eugene Marshall, The Spiritual Automaton: Spinoza's Science of the Mind, Oxford University Press, 2013, 242pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199675531.

Reviewed by Matthew J. Kisner, University of South Carolina


The title of this book is taken from an intriguing passage in the early Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, where Spinoza claims that his philosophy is distinctive for conceiving of the soul as a "spiritual automaton." According to Marshall, this means, first, that Spinoza conceives of the mind like a machine, as an organized collection of parts, operating in accordance with laws of nature. Second, it means that the soul aims to be self-directed, determined by its own internal mechanisms, like a watch. Taking this metaphor as a guiding idea, he aims to explain Spinoza's view on the mental "mechanisms" by which the mind operates, with an eye to explaining how it does so when it is self-directing and, thus, free. In this respect, Marshall employs a particular reading of Spinoza's psychology to explain his view of freedom and how people can attain it.

The basic outline of the explanation can be summarized as follows. Marshall's jumping off point is Spinoza's view that humans become self-directed through conceiving adequate ideas, which he equates with reason and knowledge. Marshall argues that these adequate ideas are innate, since they arise internally from other ideas in our mind and our essential power of reason. On this view, everything that we need to know to attain Spinoza's ethical goals is already contained in our minds. Consequently, the aim of Spinoza's ethics is to increase the psychological influence of these ideas, primarily by employing the therapeutic techniques Spinoza describes in the final part of the Ethics. Doing so results in bringing our adequate ideas into consciousness, which imposes a rational order on our thought processes, determines us to rational action and generates the mental states that Spinoza identifies with happiness and blessedness.

A central part of this explanation is an innovative reading of Spinoza's theory of the affects. Spinoza understands the affects as importantly connected to changes in our power or striving: the kinds of joy and sorrow are increases and decreases in our power, respectively, while desires are the determination of our power to some particular striving. Because Spinoza understands the mind as a mental mechanism, Marshall reasons, these changes in our power are determined by complex interactions among our ideas. Marshall identifies the affects as the ideas that are situated in one's mental mechanism so that they determine the power of the entire mind and, thus, one's total striving. According to this view, whether an idea is an affect is determined not simply by its power, but rather by what Marshall calls its impact, the role that it plays in influencing the mind's total power.

This conception of the affects is central to Marshall's original interpretation of Spinoza's view of consciousness. While Spinoza offers little explanation of consciousness, he assumes a distinction between conscious and unconscious mental states, and commentators have long debated the best way of explaining the difference. The main proposals suggest that conscious states or conscious minds are distinguished by either the complexity or the power of the ideas involved. Marshall employs his distinction between the power of an idea and its impact to propose an alternative interpretation: we are conscious of ideas that impact one's total power, "so as to increase or decrease the mind's overall power, or to move the mind as a whole to act" (120). Since Marshall equates the affectivity of an idea with its impact, this theory holds that conscious mental states are affects. Consequently, this reading is supported by texts where Spinoza suggests that we are more conscious of affects. For instance, Spinoza distinguishes the affect of desire from appetite, which is not an affect, on the grounds that we are conscious of desire (3p9).[1]

The main reasons to accept this interpretation of consciousness are not textual. Spinoza says little on the subject, and Marshall offers reasons to discount his most extended remarks (116). Rather, Marshall emphasizes that his reading has two main advantages over its chief rival, Don Garrett's view that consciousness is determined by the power of one's ideas. First, Marshall argues that his view better accommodates the distinction between conscious and unconscious mental states. Since all ideas possess some power, Garrett's view implies that we are conscious of all ideas to some degree (117), whereas Marshall's view holds that we are conscious only of ideas with affectivity, and that Spinoza allows that some ideas are not affects.

Second, Marshall argues that his view avoids two related problems for Garrett's view (117). Drawing on work by Michael LeBuffe, Marshall argues, first, that Garrett's view allows the paradoxical possibility that a mind can be conscious, although it is not conscious of any of its ideas. This is because there could be a case where the mind is composed of a great many very weak ideas, so that no idea is strong enough to enter consciousness, but the aggregate of their power is sufficient for the mind itself to be conscious. Second, Marshall argues that Garrett's view allows the converse paradoxical possibility that a mind can be unconscious but contain conscious ideas. This is because there could be a case where the mind is composed of a few ideas that are powerful enough to be conscious, but do not possess sufficient aggregate power to render the mind conscious. These paradoxes are possible if there is no systematic connection between what makes an idea conscious and what makes the mind conscious. Marshall's theory is well equipped to address this difficulty because it holds that individual ideas are conscious when they impact the total power of the mind, which entails that the consciousness of an idea is connected to the power and, thus, the consciousness of the mind.

There is much to be said in favor of Marshall's general interpretation of Spinoza. A chief advantage is that it shows how different strands of Spinoza's thinking stand together in a unified whole. For Marshall's reading shows how the therapy of Part 5, which is marginalized in some interpretations, is tightly connected to and, indeed, the culmination of Spinoza's theory of adequate ideas from Part 2, his psychology of the affects from Part 3, and his practical philosophy from Part 4. Marshall's suggestion that Spinoza conceives of the soul as a kind of mechanism also provides a clever interpretive strategy that sheds new light on a variety of Spinoza's claims. In addition to Spinoza's theory of consciousness, this interpretive strategy also provides an interesting account of the conatus doctrine, which Marshalls reads as ultimately grounded in the inertial tendency of bodies to remain in motion or rest. This, in turn, leads him to read volition, which is at least partly an expression of our conatus, as the mental analogue of momentum (77). Marshall's reading also highlights the important connection between reasoning and the affects. While it is well known that Spinoza denies any substantive distinction between cognition and affects, Marshall's view holds that we attain Spinoza's ethical goals by making our adequate ideas conscious and, thus, by transforming our rational ideas into affects. In this respect, Spinoza defies a traditional conception of rationalism.

There are, of course, challenges for the reading as well, and I will mention a few, not to criticize the book, but rather to give the reader a sense of the sort of questioning and investigation it inspires. One challenge concerns Marshall's reading of Spinoza's view of the affects and, consequently, of consciousness. Marshall's conception of the affects as ideas that impact the power of the entire mind is potentially problematic because Spinoza conceives of the affects as changes in our power, rather than the causes of those changes. While Marshall recognizes this point, insisting that affects are identical to changes in our power (88), he nevertheless commonly describes the affects as causes of changes in our power: "ideas become affects in virtue of their being causally situated in the mind in the right way, so that the exercise of their power can cause a system-wide change in the mind's conatus" (8). This is not just a case of imprecise wording. Rather, this conception of the affects is required by Marshall's theory of consciousness, since it differs from Garrett's power view by explaining conscious mental states and, consequently, affects as those that impact the overall power of the mind.

This lack of clarity makes it difficult to pin down Marshall's explanation of the affects and, consequently, of conscious mental states: when there is a change in our power, is the affect supposed to be the change, the cause or both? Marshall would likely answer that the cause is somehow constitutive of the change in our power and, thus, of the affect. The challenge is explaining why we should think that causes of changes in our power are constitutive of the resulting affects. This view doesn't seem consistent with common ways of thinking: if I am afraid of dogs, then my belief that there is a dog in the next room may cause me to experience an emotion of distress, but it doesn't seem that this belief is the same as or part of the emotion. Furthermore, this view doesn't seem consistent with Spinoza's view of the passions, which have external causes. Surely external causes of changes in our power cannot be constitutive of one's emotions: if I experience a decrease in power or sadness as a result of being hit by a car, it would seem strange to describe the car as my sadness or constitutive of it.

Regardless of how we interpret Marshall's view about the relationship between changes in our power and their causes, there is another reason to question Marshall's interpretation of the affects. According to Marshall, ideas only qualify as affects because they bring about changes in one's total or overall power. This rules out the possibility that affects can be localized changes in one's power; in other words, changes in a part of one's body and mind that are not reflected in one's overall power. But Spinoza seems to admit that such localized changes can be affects when he introduces the affects of pleasure (titillatio) and pain (dolor) (3p11s): "pleasure and pain are ascribed to a man when one part of him is affected more than the rest." He uses these affects to explain how we can experience a kind of joy even when our total power is decreasing and a kind of sorrow when our total power is increasing (4p34), which implies that an idea can be an affect, even when it does not cause a change in one's overall power.

Another challenge for Marshall's reading concerns his explanation for how adequate ideas issue in action, which he regards as a central selling point of his interpretation (5). His view, in short, is that adequate ideas become situated in our mental mechanism in such a way that they become conscious desires, which then move us to rational action. The adequate ideas in question are the dictates of reason, which Marshall regards as a kind of common notion. This aspect of Marshall's explanation lacks details. In particular, there is no explanation for how these dictates can qualify as common notions, which are supposed to apply universally to all things, like the laws of physics, and are supposed to be universally known. It is hard to see how the dictates of reason can be universally applicable, since Spinoza claims that they are derived from human nature and do not apply to animals (4p37). It is also hard to see how they can be universally known because Spinoza's main claims about desires arising from adequate ideas -- which figure prominently in Marshall's account -- concern desires arising from "true knowledge of good and evil" (4p14-7). Since Spinoza denies that good and evil are real properties, many commentators hold that we cannot have knowledge of good and evil; indeed, according to a common reading, our ideas of good and evil are illusions that we must overcome.[2] If we cannot even know good and evil, how can these ideas be common notions?

The dictates of reason are challenging for Marshall's reading in another way. A distinctive commitment of Marshall's interpretation is that reason, for Spinoza, relies very little on experience. According to Marshall, our adequate ideas are innate in the sense that their content is derived entirely from our own mind. While he claims that experience may trigger our adequate ideas -- in other words, provide the opportunity or psychological impetus for us to become more aware of these adequate ideas -- Marshall generally excludes experience from the activity of reason. While this conception of reason is well suited to explain mathematical reasoning, it is unclear how it is supposed to work in the practical domain. Spinoza indicates that we choose our actions largely on the basis of whether they promote our power, and this depends upon particular features of our practical situations, which cannot be known through adequate ideas. Consequently, it seems that inadequate ideas must play some role in practical reasoning, especially in determining how to apply reason's general dictates to particular situations. Marshall does not explain how the dictates of reason can be put into practice and, thus, how adequate ideas can move us to action without cooperation from inadequate ideas.[3] If inadequate ideas do play some role in practical reasoning and rational action, then it is not clear that human freedom involves acting entirely from self-determined adequate ideas, as Marshall suggests.

In sum, Marshall's book provides a thoughtful contribution to Spinoza scholarship, and a variety of useful tools for interpreting Spinoza's philosophical system. Because it sets forth a broad, systematic reading in an accessible manner, the book should be of interest to Spinoza scholars of diverse interests, and students as well as experts.

[1] Spinoza's Ethics is cited by part and proposition, as is standard. Translations follow The Collected Works of Spinoza, volume I, trans. Edwin Curley (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985).

[2] See Donald Rutherford, 'Spinoza and the Dictates of Reason,' Inquiry 51, no. 5 (2008): 485-511, p. 508; Yitzhak Melamed, 'Spinoza's Metaphysics of Substance: The Substance-Mode Relation as a Relation of Inherence and Predication,' Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 68, no. 1 (2009): 17-82, p. 52; Jeffrey K. McDonough, 'The Heyday of Teleology and Early Modern Philosophy,' Midwest Studies in Philosophy 35 (2011): 179-204, p. 192.

[3] For readings that emphasize the importance of inadequate ideas, experience, imagination and memory to human freedom see my Spinoza on Human Freedom: Reason, Autonomy and the Good Life (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2011) and Aurelia Armstrong, 'Autonomy and the Relational Individual: Spinoza and Feminism,' in Feminist Interpretations of Benedict Spinoza, ed. Moira Gatens (University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press, 2009), 43-64. For a reading that emphasizes the importance of these things to acting from reason's dictates, see Justin Steinberg, 'Following a Recta Ratio Vivendi: The Practical Utility of Spinoza's Dictates of Reason,' in Essays on Spinoza's Ethical Theory, eds. Matthew J. Kisner and Andrew Youpa (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014), 178-96.