The Stoic Life: Emotions, Duties, and Fate

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Tad Brennan, The Stoic Life: Emotions, Duties, and Fate, Oxford University Press, 2005, 352pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199256268

Reviewed by Gretchen Reydams-Schils, University of Notre Dame


This book is difficult to assess if one is already familiar with Stoicism. It appears to be written as an introductory text, yet this label does not do justice to the argument's sophistication. To be able to expound a complex doctrine like Stoic ethics -- rendered even more difficult by the evidence's fragmentary nature -- in a lucid and trenchant manner is in itself a sign of philosophical acumen, but Brennan goes beyond mere exposition by advancing some of his own views. Yet it is this combination of introductory discourse and original work that creates an imbalance in the work.

To summarize the book would be to write it again, so rich is its content. Suffice it here then to say that Brennan approaches the topic of Stoic ethics through psychology, in Part II (after an introductory part that locates this theme in the context of ancient thought); that the heart of the book is in Part III, on ethics; and that the final component takes into account the broader framework of fate.

Brennan has opted radically for an analytic philosophical discourse, which indicates that the book's primary audience would be students in American philosophy departments. So, a good way to approach a review would be to ask how well this mode of discourse works for the topic at hand. The mode comes with its clearly identifiable features, including obligatory references to Hume and Frege, contemporary puzzles such as Newcomb's Problem, and a bantering that likes to present us with, among other things, a (non-existent) Stoic sage apparently spending quite a bit of time brushing her teeth. (Everything a sage does matters, and is infused with her virtue, so…).

But let us turn our attention to more important matters, starting with the bibliography. Brennan's book is modeled after an earlier work in the same series, one on Epictetus by Anthony A. Long (2002). Yet even a cursory comparison reveals that whereas both authors limit their footnotes and address a general audience, as well as include further readings in annotated bibliographies, the scope of Long's recommendations is much broader than Brennan's, even though the latter's topic is less specific. Brennan's bibliography is limited primarily to works written (or translated) in English. Of those, upon closer inspection, the works of the participants in the Symposium Hellenisticum dominate, that is, of a small circle of experts who meet every three years, most of whom are cited in the Acknowledgments. Long's bibliography, by contrast, mentions whatever he considers to be the best work, even if it is in French, Italian, or German. Additionally, this reader did not quite know what to make of an awkward self-referential pun in the suggested readings such as 'but no one seems to care how I feel' (114).

An obvious 'outsider' to the circle of which Brennan considers himself a member would be Pierre Hadot. The citations from Hadot's work on Marcus Aurelius (published in English by Harvard University Press, 1998), however, and Brennan's criticism are off the mark. Brennan (315-316) overlooks that Marcus Aurelius may be different from other Stoics, such as when he has a tendency to set the mind apart both from the body and from the soul pneuma (as in 12.3), as scholars have noted. And to claim that there are preferred indifferents which leave more room for a certain exercise of virtue (as cited from Pierre Hadot on 186-87) does not amount to making the mistake that not having these indifferents undermines the sage's virtue. A poor sage has one way to display virtue, a rich one another; and it is typical of the latter that he can exercise charity and other social duties in a manner a poor person cannot. Furthermore, there is evidence that Stoics did make distinctions even among the preferred indifferents (Arius Didymus ap. Stob. 2.81-82 Wachsmuth; Diogenes Laertius 7.106-07).

Simplifications are required to make Brennan's discourse work. We are told right at the onset (10) that Chrysippus is 'one of the greatest thinkers of all time; Epictetus one of the greatest talkers.' Hence we are asked to project a contemporary conception of the philosopher onto the ancients, overlooking that hermeneutics has granted us more options than just the two categories of 'thinker' and 'talker.' A beginning reader of the Stoics, and especially one with an inclination towards philosophy, would do well to read the texts for herself, and not to take such normative judgments at face value. Brennan turns the 'thinker' Chrysippus into the cornerstone of the Stoic system, and this in spite of the fact that our evidence may not allow us to make such a clear-cut demarcation, as Brad Inwood in his recent book on Seneca has warned (2005, 25-26), calling such a picture 'an artifact of our reconstructive methodology.'

Brennan states that the Stoics, for all their high expectations of the Sage, admitted that no such Sage had ever existed. Again, this makes for a clear and neatly demarcated paradox, but our actual evidence suggests that they were waffling on this issue. The stock expression appears to have been 'none or very few.' Yet the difference between none and even one sage is much more crucial than between one and a few more, as Socrates also claims about his philosopher-king in Plato's Republic: 'the birth of one [true philosopher], if he has an obedient city, is sufficient for perfecting everything that is now doubted' (502b). It does matter whether virtue can be achieved.

Finally, I would like to examine more closely the technique of 'translating' crucial Stoic passages into premises. Let's follow the trajectory of a tyro in Stoicism using this book in the case of two examples. Most often the references of the passages quoted are in the notes at the end of the chapter, though sometimes they are included right after the quotation. The latter practice is more helpful if one wants to avoid blurring the distinctions between source text and paraphrase. On page 87, for instance, we are told that 'an impulse is an assent to an evaluative impression.' Presumably this is a paraphrase and not a direct rendering of Stoic material. As a paraphrase, however, it is problematic, because of the ambiguity of the 'is' in this definition. 'Assent' and 'impulse' are distinct functions in Stoic psychology, even though they are closely related. Diogenes Laertius indicates that in fully developed human beings 'reason intervenes as the craftsman of impulse' (7.86). The standard Stoic view is that a-rational animals and children have impressions and impulses, but not acts of assent, which come only with reason (Long and Sedley 54), even though there are exceptions in the sources on this point too. So, it could be that not all impulses require an act of assent. And the only way to find out about this crucial puzzle is by going beyond Brennan's account, and consulting collections of source material.

The second example spans about forty pages in the book (182-220): it discusses 'two models' for 'discovering the befitting,' and raises other questions. We start with two quotations from Cicero on this issue -- again not clearly separated in the layout of the page -- which presumably yield two different procedures, one focusing on virtue, the other on the selection of indifferents. These two models are then discussed, and finally Brennan comes up with a synthesis, admitting even that a crucial point in his earlier discussion may, after all, have been a 'red herring' (220). If we go back to the original passages (182-3) a reader could indeed be puzzled why we were led down such a long and winding path in the first place: both passages point to 'living according to nature', 'virtue' (pertaining to the good, as opposed to evil), and the 'selection of indifferents,' although with a different emphasis. The problem, in other words, is in the interpretation of the passages, not in the texts themselves. The previous chapters have already provided what Brennan calls 'the bridging-principles,' and the key notions of the 'good,' 'preferred indifferents,' 'appropriation' (oikeiƓsis) and its development in humans, and 'living according to nature.' What they did not explain, and this subsequent exposition does not either, is not just that, but how concerns for others fit into the Stoic picture of virtue, and are not merely added on, nor a side-effect.

At times the discourse in Brennan's work is so elementary as to provide even a couple of paragraphs on the role of divination in ancient culture (244-45), at other times he charts his own very advanced course, and only an expert reader will be able to tell where the seams are. (Brennan's earlier published work, in articles, does not display this odd combination.) In sum, then, the textbook features of this work will make Stoic ethics more accessible, but have to be used with caution and in combination with other material; the original insights of the project, in turn, will stand out more clearly if vetted against the broader background of ongoing scholarly and philosophical discussions.