The Strauss-Krüger Correspondence: Returning to Plato through Kant

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Susan Meld Shell (ed.), The Strauss-Krüger Correspondence: Returning to Plato through Kant, Palgrave Macmillan, 2018, 237pp., $84.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783319742007.

Reviewed by Catherine Zuckert, University of Notre Dame


This volume contains English translations of the letters Leo Strauss and Gerhard Krüger exchanged between 1929 and 1935, and again briefly, between 1958 and 1962, along with essays commenting on various aspects of that correspondence by eight leading scholars. Strauss is now much better known than Krüger, and most (but not all) of the commentators are Strauss scholars; but at the time of most of their correspondence, Krüger was better established. Reputed to be Heidegger's most promising student, he was lecturing at the University of Marburg. Some of the letters contain Strauss's requests for assistance from his friend in finding a supervisor for his habilitation as well as, more urgently, employment. The letters thus reveal the problems Jewish scholars in Germany faced even before the Nazis took power. The primary reason why the letters are of interest today, however, is that, agreeing that modern philosophy is fundamentally defective, Krüger and Strauss point to different, one might even say, fundamentally opposed paths from Heidegger. For Krüger, Heidegger's re-raising the question of being pointed to the importance of ontology, which involved theological and moral as well as strictly philosophical issues. For Strauss, Heidegger's "destruktion" of the Western philosophical tradition had made it possible for the first time in centuries to perceive its true roots, and thus opened up the possibility of a genuine return to classical philosophy.

Krüger and Strauss agreed that the neo-Kantian philosophy that had been dominant at the University of Marburg where they both studied had been shown to be fundamentally defective. Both were greatly impressed by Heidegger's emphasis on the importance of human "lived experience." However, both also considered "historicism" and the widespread conviction that human beings could never achieve knowledge of an eternal truth to which historicism gave rise to be the source of the contemporary crisis not merely in philosophy, but in politics and Western culture more generally. Seeking an eternally valid truth, both thought it was necessary to take the claim of revelation to be true seriously. Both thus studied theology as well as philosophy, but they studied different religious traditions from opposed viewpoints. Krüger was a self-declared believer, a Protestant at the time he was writing who later converted to Catholicism under the influence of Romano Guardini. Strauss presented himself in these letters as an avowed atheist seeking the possibility of living without faith. Understanding his Jewish identity in political rather than pious terms, he declared that if he were asked which nation he belongs to, he would answer Jew, and not German.

Both agreed that it was impossible to understand modern philosophy except in the context of its opposition to revealed religion, especially Christianity. Both agreed that it was necessary to study the history of philosophy in order to understand the roots of the contemporary crisis. For Strauss, however, the need to study the history of philosophy was a necessary propaedeutic to overcome the obstacle modern philosophy posed to recapturing "the ancient freedom of philosophizing." Krüger, on the other hand, thought that it was neither possible nor desirable to philosophize in the manner of the ancients, because of "Christ's factual domination/dominion [Herrschaft] over the spirit of post-ancient humanity . . . [even though] this dominion has become indirect in modernity" (45). The question that fundamentally divided them was, therefore, whether the coming of Christ constituted a revelation of a truth that was unavailable to the ancients, but had been incorporated by modern philosophy -- or not. Since both understood truth to be the goal of philosophy and not simply or entirely a matter of faith, their correspondence presents a rare example of the way in which philosophers who disagree on the answers to fundamental questions can nevertheless discuss those questions as well as their preferred responses usefully and respectfully.

As Daniel Tanguay observes as the beginning of his essay,"Zurück zu Plato!, Which Plato?", "the correspondence between Gerhard Krüger and Leo Strauss is a document of exceptional value for anyone interested in the genesis of the two philosophers' thought and in the more general history of German philosophy in the inter-war period" (125). However, he warns, "it is nevertheless important not to disregard its unfinished and sometimes completely experimental character." The correspondence

has the defects and positive qualities of the epistolary genre: it presents in a direct and intimate manner arguments and philosophic positions which are or will be developed in more finished works, but, at the same time, the very condensed character of the writing makes it difficult to grasp certain arguments in all their nuances. (127)

The eight essays following the translation of the correspondence thus prove to be extremely helpful in furthering readers' understanding of both the context and the content of the letters.

In "The Light Shed on the Crucial Development of Strauss's Thought by His Correspondence with Gerhard Krüger" Thomas L. Pangle seeks to answer one of the first questions a reader might raise. Emphasizing the theological interest that Strauss shared with Krüger (in contrast, for example, to Strauss's closest friend, Jacob Klein), Pangle reports, Strauss's letters to Krüger reveal the way in which Strauss directed his friend to state Strauss's intention in his review of Spinoza's Critique of Religion more clearly and directly than Strauss himself could (because of the opposition of his employers). Even more important, the letters show how it began

to dawn on Strauss that what is most profound and valuable in the medieval Judeo-Arabic thinkers is the guidance they give back to Plato -- as above all a political philosopher: that is, to a Plato . . . radically different from what is conventionally understood by modern scholarship, shaped by the tradition of Christian or Augustinian Platonism. (98)

In "replying to Krüger's expressed reservations about Strauss's contention that all specifically 'modern' thought dwells in a 'cave beneath Plato's cave,'" Strauss writes that "the 'substantial and historical core' of historicism is, as you correctly say, 'the factual domination of Christ over the post-classical world.' " But, he asks: "What follows from that, for him, who does not believe . . . [and] thus denies . . . the divine right, of this domination?" Strauss acknowledges that "the immediate consequence -- in Heidegger among others -- is [that] Christianity has brought to light facts of human life, that were unknown or inadequately known to ancient philosophy"; and this means that "after the disintegration of Christianity, there remains . . . philosophy that preserves the 'truth' of Christianity," and that this philosophy "is as such deeper and more radical than ancient philosophy." Strauss concedes that this conclusion may be correct, but he insists that "it must be as such proven. And this is possible only on the basis of a direct confrontation of modern with ancient philosophy. So much on the legitimation of my project as regards Hobbes -- I mean, the direct confrontation with Plato" (99).

In "The Example of Socrates: The Correspondence between Leo Strauss and Gerhard Krüger," David Janssens reminds readers that the book Strauss later published on The Political Philosophy of Hobbes: Its Basis and Its Genesis culminates in such a confrontation of Hobbes with Plato. In order to overthrow traditional natural right, Strauss argues, Hobbes was compelled "to return to its foundations, that is, to Socrates, whom he acknowledged to be the founder of traditional political philosophy. More precisely, he was compelled to try and repeat the Socratic foundation, in order to be able to criticize it and prove a new and better foundation" (115). However, "Hobbes was prevented from genuinely repeating the Socratic foundation because he failed to perceive the radically untraditional question underlying traditional natural right" (116). Hobbes thought that the Socratic question concerning the right order of humans living together, as determined by reason, had been answered by the Aristotelian tradition and its definitions of justice and virtue. "For Hobbes, as opposed to Socrates, the possibility of philosophy, in particular political philosophy, was self-evident" (116). It was, therefore, no longer a question, as it had been for Socrates and Plato.

According to Strauss, "Hobbes fundamentally and 'disastrously' misunderstood Plato in supposing that the latter's philosophy starts from ideas instead of words" (117). In other words, Hobbes (mis)understood Plato because he read the ancient philosophy in light of the traditional Christian interpretation of his thought. Although Strauss and Krüger agreed that it was necessary to return to Socratic questioning, Tanguay thus argues, they did not and could not agree on the character of that questioning or what Plato showed about it. Even though Krüger insisted that what one believed or did not believe was not relevant to the philosophical question of truth, and Strauss maintained that his lack of belief was an opinion that needed to be subjected to examination, Tanguay insists, the "Plato" whose philosophy pointed forward to the revelation of the Christian truth, according to Augustine (and Krüger) necessarily looks different from the zetetic philosopher Strauss recovered as a result of his studies of Jewish-Arabic philosophy.

In "Moral Finitude and Ontology of Creation: The Kantian Interpretation of Gerhard Krüger," Luc Langlois explains how Krüger read Kant. Whereas Strauss saw the two roots of the Western tradition in Greek philosophy and Scriptural revelation to be fundamentally opposed, Krüger

saw the metaphysical aim of philosophy to be at its heart a theological question -- a concern for the divine, and, therefore, for that which transcends our limited subjective perspectives. . . . Christianity gave this philosophic orientation its fundamental ontological meaning, namely, that of the ens creatum founded in God's creative goodness. The implication . . . is that the first truth of the human situation and of our being is dependent on the pre-existing, irrecoverable given of Divine creation. The moral meaning of this creation is what Krüger sought . . . to explore and examine in his book on Kant. By the same token, in his view, only the philosophical horizon afforded by natural theology afforded an elucidation of the essence of Christian existence. (144)

In the introduction to Philosophie und Moral in der Kantischen Kritik, Krüger explains that his interpretation of Kant derives its decisive thrust from Heidegger's phenomenology. However, it diverges from Heidegger's own reading of Kant on the main issue. Krüger agrees with Heidegger that "the gist of the Critique of Pure Reason consists in bringing out the 'finitude' of man as the essential foundation of ontology." However, Krüger maintains, "in Kant's view, the finitization of man does not occur, as it does in Heidegger, in the absolute end -- namely, death -- but in moral obedience to unconditional command" (146). Langlois then gives an account of the way in which Krüger derived his conclusions concerning the importance of natural theology in Kant from the Critique of Pure Reason and the Critique of Judgment.

In light of "Kant's importance in shaping the intellectual milieu in which the younger Strauss was educated and against which he, along with many of his early intellectual companions . . . rebelled more or less explicitly," Susan Shell observes in "Gerhard Krüger and Leo Strauss: The Kant Motif, "one of the persistent puzzles of Strauss scholarship is the absence in any of his published works of a thematic treatment of Immanuel Kant" (165). She thus attempts to supply an account of Strauss's subdued auseinandersetzung with Kant in three stages: his writings on Hermann Cohen, his correspondence with Krüger, and the revised understanding of the conflict between reason and revelation Strauss presented in a paper delivered at the Hartford Seminary in 1948. By limiting the scope of reason through his critiques, Strauss argued, Kant had not defended religion so much as he had placed faith and reason on different planes so that they could peacefully coexist. As a result, he had obscured their "life-and-death struggle for hegemony on the single plane of the 'truth'" (169)." Since reason and religion both made claims about the facts of human life, Strauss insisted, they needed to confront each other. In his 1957 seminar on Plato's Republic Strauss stated the fundamental philosophical issue he saw dividing the moderns from the ancients as follows:

Science . . . supplies a frame of reference which in principle can be common to all men as men. Now there are two ways of conceiving this natural frame of reference. . . . Kant says there is a natural frame of reference which is given by the structure of the human mind. This implies the distinction between the thing in itself and the phenomenon. This whole perception or understanding . . . is relative to man. . . . [Plato asserts the opposite]: This natural frame of reference is identical with the inner order of the whole. We are by nature dimly aware of the essential structure of the whole. (179 n 26)

In "Natural Right and Historical Consciousness in Strauss and Krüger's Exchange," Alberto Ghibellini describes the way in which Strauss approached "the question of natural right as part of the broader question of the possibility of a meaningful philosophical thought, whose goal is an 'eternal' and 'absolute' truth" (183). He studied Hobbes not only as "the author who, 'living in an illiberal world, lays the foundations of liberalism,'" but also because Hobbes emphasizes "the role of 'nature' . . . seen as an original condition of disorder that must be superseded by the intervention of 'culture' and the civil state" (183). Plato showed Strauss that Hobbes was wrong.

According to Hobbes . . . order is artificially established, and natural right is an originally unrestrained liberty that, if left unleashed, brings unbearable disorder. Under these circumstances, only a natural right understood as a legitimate subjective claim can be affirmed.

Yet the myth of the Statesman suggests that

some residual form of 'providence' or rational order never leaves the whole . . . [so] even when the most disorderly and chaotic stage is reached, one can never claim a right to everything . . . since at least a natural and objective 'standard,' . . . remains available for human beings to attempt to discern. (185)

Like Carl Schmitt, Ghibellini shows Strauss was a critic of liberalism. But in seeking to re-open the ancient philosophical quest for knowledge of what is truly good as a quest, Strauss did not take a "decisionist" stance against liberalism the way Schmitt had. Nor did he exhibit any sympathy for the Nazis. In fact, Ghibellini argues Strauss's letters to Krüger show that he quickly moved away from what appeared to be a validation of the "fascist, authoritarian and imperial principles of the right" in opposition to liberalism in his infamous letter to Karl Löwith of May 19, 1933.

In his concluding essay, "History and Modernity in the Strauss-Krüger Correspondence," Richard Velkley shows how the positions and arguments each of the philosophers presents in the letters need to be filled out and clarified by looking at their later works. His account of the history of philosophy Krüger presented in lectures he delivered from 1942 to 1952 is especially helpful.

I have only two slight criticisms to make of the book. First, the subtitle is misleading. Krüger may have returned to Plato through Kant, but Strauss certainly did not. Second, an essay describing the Augustinian interpretation of Plato that Krüger seems to have embraced and that Strauss rejected would have helped readers understand the content and significance of their differences better.