The Structure of Enquiry in Plato's Early Dialogues

Placeholder book cover

Vasilis Politis, The Structure of Enquiry in Plato's Early Dialogues, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 255pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107068117.

Reviewed by Alex Long, University of St Andrews


At the start of Plato's Meno Socrates is challenged to say whether or not virtue can be taught. He says in reply that he does not even know what virtue is. He then issues a challenge of his own: can Meno, his self-confident interlocutor, tell him what virtue is? The following section of the dialogue is then taken up with an enquiry into this second question: what is virtue? But the original question -- whether or not virtue can be taught -- is not forgotten, and later in the conversation Meno draws Socrates back to it even though they have not found out what virtue is. Vasilis Politis focuses on the relationship between these two kinds of question: 'whether or not' questions and 'what is' questions. Throughout the book he calls the latter 'ti esti questions'. ('Ti esti' is Greek for 'what is'.) 'Definitional questions' may seem a better label, but according to Politis the question itself does not require the answer to take the form of a definition. A ti esti question has an everyday application, where pointing to an example would be a satisfactory answer. If a teacher asked his pupil 'what is a river?', the pupil should not be corrected if his answer is simply to point to a river visible to them both. Why then does Socrates not make more use of examples in his examination of ti esti questions? According to Politis, the need to avoid examples derives from the other kind of question, 'whether or not' questions, or rather from the special character of the 'whether or not' questions in Plato's early dialogues.

Some 'whether or not' questions, such as whether virtue can be taught, allow for apparently powerful arguments on either side. In Plato's dialogues this usually emerges in a debate between two or more people who might be expected to take opposed positions. But sometimes argument on either side is not merely a symptom of the adversarial context: one and the same person could find reasons both for and against the thesis that is being questioned. (In the Meno Socrates argues that virtue is knowledge, and so teachable, but then he himself argues on empirical grounds that virtue cannot be taught.) According to Politis, when a question allows for argument on either side and it is hard to see how to resolve the conflict between arguments, the question expresses a problem or aporia (here again Politis uses the Greek word throughout the book).

Such a problem is, in Politis's special use of the term, 'radical' if it shakes confidence in supposed examples of one of the concepts in the question. Let us suppose that we are considering whether virtue is teachable. Examining the reasons for and against its being teachable may make it doubtful whether supposed examples of virtue really do exemplify virtue. If so, the question 'is virtue teachable?' expresses a problem that is 'radical' in relation to the concept 'virtue'. (Often in the book Politis says that examples of virtue or some other concept are 'rendered questionable' -- it is not clear to me whether he means that, as a matter of fact, the enquirer comes to doubt the examples or that it becomes rational to doubt the examples regardless of whether the enquirer realises this and actually experiences doubt.) The enquirer now lacks a standard by which to judge what is and is not virtuous and so must turn his attention to a distinct question: what is virtue? Sometimes an example would be a satisfactory answer to a ti esti question, but in this case the enquiry should be conducted independently of examples given that the examples have themselves become questionable. All the same, there is some prospect of success: according to Politis, in these cases answering the ti esti question with a general, unitary and explanatory definition is a sufficient as well as a necessary condition for answering the original question. We can thus understand why ti esti questions are pursued quite so urgently by Socrates in the early dialogues even though a different type of question has primary importance.

Politis develops his account by exploring a range of further philosophical questions. He offers careful reflections on the nature of the ti esti question, different kinds of primacy or priority, and the different kinds of value that reasons for and against a thesis can possess. Politis also takes pains to show that he is offering a distinctive account of Plato, and in this he surely succeeds. According to Politis, in the early dialogues -- including even the so-called 'dialogues of definition' -- enquiries are launched by non-definitional questions, such as whether virtue can be taught. The prominence of ti esti questions, the kind of answer that they require and the methods used to answer them are all explained in terms of the difficulty of these 'whether or not' questions. Insofar as Socrates has a theory about the importance of definitions, it concerns their importance not for attaining knowledge but rather for answering particularly problematic questions: do not proceed without a definition of a concept if a 'whether or not' question has made it doubtful what exemplifies the concept. Politis also sees as distinctive his account of the place of aporia in Socratic enquiry. As one would expect, Politis acknowledges that aporia is sometimes used to describe confusion or bafflement at the end of an unsuccessful enquiry, but he argues that it can also be used of the 'problem' or 'difficulty' that gets an enquiry started, and it is this use that really interests him. (It has to be said that Plato's use of the noun and cognate verb at the start of enquiries is already noted in the standard English lexicon for ancient Greek, Liddell-Scott-Jones.) He is very much alive to the affinities between his interpretation of Plato and ancient sceptical argument: he does not conclude that Plato was a sceptic, but he argues that Julia Annas's rejection of Plato's scepticism is overstated.

Politis obviously hopes that his book will be of interest to philosophers who do not work on Plato or ancient philosophy: at one point he advises some of his readers to skip a discussion of the textual evidence (218 n.2). If the book is judged by this standard, an advantage of his approach is that it detaches the structure of Socratic enquiry from divisive or eccentric positions in epistemology and metaphysics. You do not need to be a Platonist about knowledge or reality to accept that, in an enquiry, questions are interrelated in the way Politis describes.

As an account of Plato the book seems to have grown out of Politis's work on the Meno and Protagoras. These two dialogues clearly isolate a difficult 'whether or not' question: can virtue be taught? But Politis does not do enough to show how his interpretation applies to the dialogues where a 'whether or not' question is not so sharply posed. At the start of the Gorgias Socrates turns immediately to a ti esti question (what is Gorgias's profession and art?), prompted not by some distinct question but, so far as we can tell, by the news that Gorgias has been giving a rhetorical display. As Politis observes, 'whether or not' questions are raised later in the Gorgias, but at the start of the dialogue a ti esti question needs no 'whether or not' question to motivate it.

By contrast, at the start of the Laches there is more than one candidate for the 'whether or not' question. Its ti esti enquiry (what is courage?) is preceded by a long discussion of education and the interlocutors' credentials, where the questions are 'is any of us qualified to give advice about education?', 'is it worth training our sons to fight with weapons and heavy armour?' and 'should we train them in something else?' (180a). It is not correct to say that the opening discussion is 'entirely' about the second of these three questions (109). And in the Laches the problem with examples of courage is not that examples have been made unreliable by the introductory questions. When asked 'what is courage?', Laches says that it is courageous to stand your ground in battle and not retreat, and Socrates's objection to that answer does not refer back to the questions in the opening discussion. (He points out that some non-Greek peoples fight while retreating and that even Greeks sometimes win battles by means of a well-judged, temporary retreat -- and so Laches has not identified what confers courage upon every courageous person and act.)

Even in the Meno, where the identity and difficulty of the 'whether or not' question are obvious, it is far from obvious that examples of virtue are unreliable or problematic because of that question rather than for some other reason. Socrates and Meno would not agree whether a woman's running a city justly constitutes an example of virtue, but this has nothing to do with the question about teaching virtue. The source of the disagreement lies elsewhere: Meno believes that this would be the virtue of a man, not a woman, whereas Socrates believes that virtue is the same in women as in men. Here and elsewhere, examples are problematic, inadequate or unhelpful independently of some 'whether or not' question and its difficulty.

In the works Politis considers, Socrates claims both to test other people's knowledge or expertise and to enquire into moral properties. A central challenge for any interpretation of Plato's Socrates is how to relate his moral enquiry to his testing of knowledge. One approach is to give special status to the Apology, where testing knowledge and exposing ignorance are a particularly prominent theme, and to treat it as a guide to the dialogical works. The outcome of that approach is that Socrates's real aim is to test other people's knowledge or expertise. Politis's account lies at the opposite extreme: the Apology receives comparatively short attention (13), and Socrates's business is enquiry. In the account of Socratic enquiry Politis is reluctant to allow that Socrates uses as premises in his arguments the beliefs of his interlocutor. Behind that reluctance there lies a suspicion that this will make his arguments ad hominem and that ad hominem arguments are philosophically uninteresting: we do not want Socrates's arguments to depend 'on what the interlocutor happens, apparently for no particular reason and without critical reflection, to believe' (53). But that is to treat Socrates's interlocutors in the dialogues as real people. If we think of the interlocutors as Platonic artifacts, then there is no reason to suppose that their beliefs are a random assortment. Plato may have given an interlocutor a set of beliefs whose relationship with each other, and with the views associated with Socrates, is worth exploring. There would then be little to fear, and perhaps much to gain, from relating Socrates's arguments to the dialectical context.

The word 'early' in the book's title is not discussed at any length: Politis refers in the first footnote to research on the early dialogues' common stylistic features, but despite the absence of scare quotes he avoids committing himself to any claim about their date of composition. Arguably that is the most reasonable attitude, and nobody should expect every book on Plato to contain a section about development, unity and the chronological order of the dialogues. But it is strange to treat the 'early' dialogues as a unit without some hypothesis, chronological or otherwise, that explains their philosophical unity. In the Hippias Major Socrates reveals that he is aggressively questioned by himself, and Politis uses this as evidence that Socrates is most intent on testing not his interlocutor but himself; despite Politis's promise not to take for granted the unity of the dialogues (1 n.1), the implication that the Hippias Major throws light on Socrates's aims in other dialogues is allowed to stand. (The presentation of the textual evidence by means of 'case studies' also presupposes that these dialogues are in some sense a unit.) But if the texts have merely stylistic similarity with one another, what reason is there for thinking that in all the 'early' dialogues Socrates's real or primary aim is to test himself? By the same token, there is nothing to prevent stylistically similar dialogues from experimenting with different ways to motivate the ti esti question, not all of which turn on the special difficulty of some other question.