The Structure of Moral Revolutions: Studies of Changes in the Morality of Abortion, Death, and the Bioethics Revolution

Placeholder book cover

Robert Baker, The Structure of Moral Revolutions: Studies of Changes in the Morality of Abortion, Death, and the Bioethics Revolution, MIT Press, 2019, 317pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262043083.

Reviewed by Laurence B. McCullough, Zucker School of Medicine/Baylor College of Medicine (Emeritus)


Robert Baker brings to this remarkable book his training in the history and philosophy of science in synergy with decades of experience as a philosopher in the clinical setting and a pioneering scholar in the history of medical ethics. Baker's book makes an outstanding addition to the Basic Bioethics series edited by Arthur Caplan for the MIT Press.

This synergy is on full display in this intellectual tour de force that makes a compelling case for philosophers to rethink moral philosophy and for bioethicists to rethink bioethics. Neither concerns a "static conception of moral concepts and paradigms," (p. 213) including "a common or universal morality" (pp. 209-210). "My first concern is simply that a common morality does not exist, never has, and, moreover, never should. Full stop. Period." (p. 211) A "dynamic conception of morality" (p. 203) requires that moral philosophy and bioethics deploy historical scholarship in case studies of the initial formulation and development of dynamic ethical concepts, the paradigms they enable, and the success or failure of moral paradigms. This approach rejects both essentialism -- ethical concepts and paradigms are timeless and therefore transcultural -- and presentism -- the view that our moral concerns are the same as the moral concerns of historical figures and their texts.

Baker is a precise philosopher, clearly explaining the key concepts he deploys here. First, the concept of morality.

I use the term "morality" to refer to the framework of communal standards for character and conduct that a community's members internalize and use to praise aspects of people's character and conduct as "moral" (or "good") and to criticize, censure, or chastise those who flout or act contrary to these standards as "immoral" (or "bad"). (p. 17)

Next, the goal of analyzing dynamic morality.

The central thesis of this book is that morality changes, that these changes involve drifts, reforms, revolutions, and counterrevolutions, and that analyzing these changes yields fundamental insights into the nature of morality. (p. 50)

Third, paradigm, moral drift, moral reform, and moral revolution.

The reader is alerted by the title of Baker's book of his considerable debt to the philosophy of science of Thomas Kuhn. From Kuhn he takes the concept of paradigms, or "ways of conceiving or 'seeing as'." (p. 10) Moral paradigms comprise "the framework of communal standards for character and conduct that a community's members internalize" (p. 17) Moral paradigms can change by what Baker calls "moral drift" that occurs when "external forces, acting without any conscious intention to effect a change, have altered the community's sense of morality." (p. 21) "Moral reform" occurs when dissidents from the community's morality "intend simply to alter the impact of some interpretations of moral norms or the laws enforcing them, without changing underlying moral paradigms." (p. 21) "Moral revolutions," by contrast, occur when dissidents have the "intent . . . to alter underlying moral paradigms," (p. 21) resulting in a paradigm shift. Baker means for the analogy to Kuhn on scientific revolutions to be direct. (p. 42) A moral counterrevolution occurs when dissidents aim to alter a current, dominant moral paradigm by invoking an existing, less dominant paradigm as the replacement.

Following Kuhn, Baker treats paradigms as conceptual frameworks that develop in and are sustained -- or not -- by communities. For Kuhn, scientific investigation creates the opportunity to posit previously unrecognized connections between or among observations, or hypothesis formation. When exploring a hypothesis can occur within a paradigm, normal science occurs. When a hypothesis is discordant with current paradigms, scientific revolution ensues to create a new, adequate paradigm.

Baker also follows Kuhn by developing his account of moral change in the context of historical case studies. These case studies illustrate how conceptual revision (reform) or transformation (revolution) by moral reformers or revolutionaries who identify and critique anomalies (character or behavior that a current moral paradigm struggles to accommodate) is but the first step toward moral change. The second step is effective dissemination of new ideas. The third step is their incorporation into social rules and laws in ways that resolve problems with which an existing moral paradigm was seen to have struggled but failed. The fourth step is social acceptance, signaled in the fifth step: abandonment of the discourse of the current morality in favor of the discourses introduced by reform or revolution. Thirteen characteristics identify the individually necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for a moral revolution, not all of which apply to moral reform and moral drift.

Textbooks of bioethics, typically, start and end with the first of these five steps. A major criticism of Baker's is that such a truncated approach to bioethics -- and moral philosophy generally -- is inadequate philosophically. Successful moral concepts have both conceptual and social implications, both of which become components of concepts enriched to a far higher level than that possible using the truncated approach. On my reading, through Kuhn, Baker implicitly invokes the strain in American pragmatism that emphasizes the social dimension of philosophical concepts.

In his first chapter Baker presents Kuhnian historical case studies to illustrate the stepwise characteristics of moral drift, moral reform, and moral revolution. The case study, "destigmatizing bastardy in America and Britain" illustrates moral drift. The case study, "the American antiduelling reforms," illustrates moral reform. Baker emphasizes that moral reforms do indeed result in change but not as a result of a paradigm shift or change but as a result of changes only in the "scope or interpretations of moral norms and their legal counterparts" that "leave no semantic tracks in our language." (p. 40) The third case study, "the LGBT/gay rights moral revolution" illustrates moral revolution.

moral revolutions, like their scientific and political counterparts, involve new paradigms incompatible with traditionally accepted paradigms. These new ways of conceiving and perceiving the forms of moral life alter the assessment of morality and immorality in ways that are reflected in novel forms of language and altered forms of conduct and, often, changes in the law as well. (p. 40)

Baker's experience as a clinical ethicist manifests itself at the end of his first chapter, which culminates in a tabular checklist of the characteristics of moral revolution, reform, and drift. Checklists constitute an essential component of patient safety and quality in the clinical setting, including clinical ethical checklists, e.g., for the implementation of patients' advance directives or immediate organ procurement after rapid determination by cardiopulmonary criteria that death has occurred. Baker's checklist illustrates in a compact and therefore highly accessible fashion how moral reform differs from moral revolution by not including paradigm inversion and subsequent paradigm shift, the invention of new concepts, and obsolescence of the discourses of a current moral paradigm. Reform aims at conservative improvement of morality. Moral drift differs from moral revolution by lacking dissidents who identify anomalies in a current paradigm and engage in self-conscious critical appraisal of it. Notwithstanding, moral drift results in a paradigm shift that obsolesces the discourses of a current moral paradigm. Moral drift should be seen as an unselfconscious, radical change of morality. Moral revolutions should be seen as self-conscious, radical change of morality led by conceptual, social, and legal dissidents. Baker builds the next four chapters around the application of his checklist to historical case studies. By closing each chapter with a concise review of the characteristics of moral revolutions, the checklist becomes an essential tool for assessing the quality of the historical case studies.

In my view, this checklist can become a powerful pedagogical tool in teaching bioethics, especially in upper division undergraduate courses and in graduate seminars, theses, and dissertations. It is a rare scholarly book in moral philosophy or bioethics that has such extraordinary pedagogical promise.

The second chapter describes the moral revolution about the moral status of the bodies of the dead. In the clinical setting, a patient newly declared to have died -- either by cardiopulmonary or brain-function criteria -- no longer exists. He or she is survived by a cadaver, referred to as "it." The masculine or feminine pronouns no longer apply. As an "it" the fresh cadaver has use and value in the clinical setting, as a source of tissue or organs to procure for transplantation or research. I teach medical students and residents that the fresh cadaver should, from the perspectives of transplantation medicine and biomedical research, be considered a public health resource. Respectfully removing organs and tissues with appropriate consent has become routine and not "wholesale desecration of the sacrosanct remains of deceased poor folk." (p. 81) As Baker shows, this paradigm of the moral status of a fresh cadaver is not timeless but the product of a moral revolution set in motion by a philosopher, Jeremy Bentham (1748-1832), and his followers, the Benthamites.

Baker draws two key lessons from this case study. Philosophers usually do not have the skill set of the moral revolutionary but they can ally with those who do. And when such alliances are formed, success does not come "easily, uncontroversially, and without a prolonged period during which dissidents hone the arguments that eventually undermine established paradigms." (p. 81)

The third chapter disabuses the reader of the idea that abortion has always been about the presentist concept of the "humanity" of the fetus, its moral status. (pp. 86-87) Baker shows that this paradigm resulted from the recent, nineteenth-century moral revolution of doctors based on the biomedical idea of "the continuous development of the fetus as an independent human being" (p. 109) that became the driver of a campaign to change social mores and the law. This campaign, and not religions opposed to abortion, worked: "the sinless, guiltless, and legally tolerated practice of prequickening abortion was replaced by an incompatible alternative conception of abortion as a sinful, guilt-ridden, illegal act of homicide." (p. 113)

The fourth chapter introduces the reader to irredentist counterrevolutions regarding heliocentrism, continental drift, and prohibitions against birth control and abortion. Baker uses "'irredentist' to refer to any intellectual, moral, or scientific community that by retaining allegiance to an older paradigm remains outside of a consensus of paradigms embraced by a larger intellectual, moral, or scientific community." (p. 121) Baker invites his readers to understand first-wave and second-wave feminism in the context of irredentism in astronomy and geology, a one-of-kind juxtaposition in bioethics. Baker describes how the feminist movement challenged patriarchal control of women's reproductive capacity by deploying the concept of the right to control one's body. The result was a "paradigm shift from fetal rights to female rights that would normalize abortion as a medical procedure." (p. 138) Social success was achieved by the 1973 ruling of the U.S. Supreme Court that affirmed in Roe v. Wade and Doe v. Bolton that before viability the decision-making of a pregnant woman and her physician about the disposition of her pregnancy should be free of state interference, except to protect the health of the woman.

There is a case to be made that this feminist counterrevolution reached its high-water mark in 1973 but was then defeated by Justice O'Connor in her 1992 opinion in Planned Parenthood v. Casey. Without overturning Roe, O'Connor eviscerated it. A constitutional right to privacy that could be limited only by the state's compelling interest was replaced by a liberty interest that could be limited so long as the limitation did not create an undue burden on access to abortion services. Abortion jurisprudence was thus provided a secure foundation in the text of the 14th Amendment and simultaneously stripped of rights language. Justice Blackmun, the author of Roe's majority opinion, concurred. He did not object to the counter-counterrevolutionary paradigm shift, away from a right to control one's body in the privacy of the physician-patient relationship, toward an interest in doing so. Blackmun's terse surrender accepts the obsolescence of the discourse of the right to control one's body by the far less consequential discourse of an interest in doing so. Baker stopped this case study too soon.

The fifth chapter recounts the bioethics revolution in the United States. The paradigm of the "doctor-knows-best medical paternalism" (p. 156) of the physician or clinical investigator and the obedience of patients, captured in Talcott Parson's sociology of the sick role (pp. 154-156), or research subjects was replaced by the paradigm of the autonomous patient or research subject. The physician-patient relationship became the patient-physician relationship, the creature of "principled antipaternalism." (p. 173) The publications of research centers, governmental organizations, professional associations of physicians, and agencies that accredit healthcare organizations "normalized" the bioethics revolution, reinforced in common and statutory law.

Baker accurately describes the motivating assumption in bioethics that physicians were committed to medical paternalism for millennia before bioethicists corrected this error. This assumption does not withstand scholarly scrutiny. Hippocratic physicians were enjoined to keep the ingredients of remedies secret from the sick, not to protect the sick from the harm of knowledge, but to protect trade secrets before the era of patents. Only from the perspective of essentialism is this paternalism. Physicians understood themselves to have a duty to give patients bad news but described the burden of this duty for the physician, not the patient, as "most disagreeable" (Gregory 1772, p. 35) and "peculiarly alarming, when executed by him". (Percival 1803, p. 32). Acting to protect self-interests, rather than to protect patients from the harm of knowledge, is not paternalism. The plain language of these two pivotal texts in the global history of medical ethics undermines the motivating, essentialist assumption of the bioethics revolution.

The final chapter underscores the key elements of moral revolutions. These include the shaping of alternative paradigms and their effective dissemination: "paradigm shifts can have no impact on morality or science unless they are made public and shared with the wider community." (p. 200) Only with this social component in place does it become possible for a "community (or at least its opinion leaders and power brokers) to peer through the lens of the alternative paradigm and see its promise." (p. 201, emphasis original) Baker closes with rebuttal of the charge that his account commits him to a disabling moral relativism, in the course of which he rejects the idea of a common morality as the required corrective.

The footnotes to each chapter are gathered after Chapter 6. This choice strengthens the narrative arc of the book that culminates in its final chapter. The 23-page, smaller-size-font bibliography testifies to the comprehensive scholarly research this book required and also creates an indispensable point of departure for future scholars of the history and philosophy of moral change. Finally, it is very important that books be accessible "from the back," via a comprehensive, easy-to-use index. In my view, the very high-quality index in this book fits the bill, a nice contribution to the irredentist counterrevolution in indexing.

Full disclosureIn response to the invitation from the NDPR Editor in Chief to prepare this book review, I informed Professor Gutting that I am co-editor with Professor Baker of The Cambridge World History of Medical Ethics (2009) and taught the history of professional ethics in medicine for him in the proseminar of a master’s program that he started and directed for many years. 


Gregory, John. 1772. Lectures on the Duties and Qualifications of a Physician. London: W. Strahan and T. Cadell.

Percival, Thomas. 1803. Medical Ethics, or a Code of Institutes and Precepts, Adapted to the Professional Conduct of Physicians and Surgeons. London: J. Johnson & R. Bickerstaff.