The Structure of Objects

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Kathrin Koslicki, The Structure of Objects, Oxford University Press, 2008, 288pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199539895.

Reviewed by Paul Hovda, Reed College



From the Preface: "The main purpose of this book is to give an analysis of ordinary material objects, those material objects to which we take ourselves to be committed in ordinary, scientifically informed discourse." The focus is on the mereological aspects of such an analysis: composition, constitution, the relation of part to whole, etc. The thesis is that the proper analysis will accord a prominent place to structure, in a rather robust neo-Aristotelian manner: objects have formal as well as material components. While her defense of this thesis is plausible and original, a fair amount is left open about the exact nature of the formal components of objects. Along the way to her end, Koslicki gives useful discussions of other contemporary and ancient approaches to her problem. While a fair amount of her discussion derives from her previous journal papers, much of it is new.

The book has four main Parts. In the first, Koslicki presents and discusses what she refers to as the "Standard Conception" of composition, which is, roughly, that a certain formal theory, here called Classical Extensional Mereology (CEM), gives a correct general characterization of our mereological concepts of part, compose, and so on. Koslicki is largely critical of the Standard Conception.

Part Two presents and criticizes a contemporary alternative to the Standard Conception, due to Kit Fine. While it gives a prominent role to structure, Koslicki finds that it involves too many mysterious primitives, has a far too liberal conception of structure (and hence posits a super-abundance of objects -- trout-turkeys and worse), and seems not to respect the Weak Supplementation Principle, which Koslicki thinks is plausibly essential to the notion of parthood.

Part Three goes back to Plato and Aristotle, discussing and finding inspiration in some of their main mereological ideas.

Part Four develops Koslicki's own structure-based approach. Material objects come in kinds, and for each kind K there is "a sort of recipe" for making a K, a recipe that specifies two main requirements: a list of types of ingredients, and a structure imposed on the ingredients. Some objects compose an object of kind K just in case they have the types and structure prescribed by the K-recipe. The recipe is somehow given by some entities called formal components, and such entities are parts of typical objects. For example, Koslicki's analysis of a particular broom would go roughly like this: The broom has two main material parts, a particular handle and a particular brush. It also has some formal components as parts, ones that specify, among other things, that (as a member of the kind broom) its material parts must include a handle and a brush, and that the former must be suitably attached to the latter. Part Four includes a general discussion of the need to recognize both material and formal parts of objects, a defense of the idea that objects generally fall into kinds, and an elucidation of the nature of the formal components, or the structure, of objects.


Many of the critical points in Part One will be familiar to researchers in the field. Koslicki is against the unrestricted composition principle of CEM (according to which for any things, there is at least one object composed of those things) for its infamous "generation" of lots of bizarre objects. She also charges that, on the Standard View, "there is no difference between a heap of unassembled motorcycle parts piled up in someone's garage and the motorcycle in running condition that results from assembling these parts in a particular way" (p. 4.). This charge doesn't quite stick, I think, for neither of the two main representatives of the Standard View that Koslicki discusses (Thomson and Lewis) actually holds that if a motorcycle is composed of some motorcycle components (wheels, engine, etc.) at some time, then, at every time at which those components exist, that motorcycle also exists and is composed of those components. (Roderick Chisholm is a more appropriate target -- see Chapter III of Person and Object.) Those who hold views on which a statue and a lump of clay can be identical even though it is true to say such things as "the statue would not have survived being squashed" and "the lump would have survived being squashed" should read Koslicki's Chapter III, for she has an interesting criticism and challenge for such views. In short: such views say that some predicates cannot be used in Leibniz'-Law style substitution; but it is impossible to find a principled way to rule out the "bad" substitution inferences while retaining the "good" ones.

Koslicki's discussion of Plato and Aristotle, in Part III, is rather interesting, and presents mereological ideas that, to the modern philosopher, are somewhat alien, but are, as Koslicki puts it, "amazingly subtle and ambitious." The scholarly detail in the chapter on Aristotle is impressive, but will make for tough going to those unfamiliar with Aristotle; they might begin with section VII.2.12 of Koslicki's book, which provides a nice summary of some of the issues Koslicki discusses in the Plato and Aristotle chapters, in connection with her own approach. In fact, that section is not a bad place to begin to be introduced to Koslicki's own view.

Now let us turn to the positive view Koslicki develops in Part IV. Here she makes an interesting suggestion about the methodology of mereology and its role in metaphysics (see esp. p. 171). Roughly put: ontology comes first, mereology second. (And we can take "ontology" here in a fairly broad sense, including existence and persistence conditions and perhaps more.) Our philosophical theory of mereological notions should be constrained in advance by our ontology, and should not make an independent contribution to ontology. We start off by recognizing, on the basis of "common sense" and science, certain objects like tables, table-legs, cats, and legs of cats. To engage in philosophical mereology, we then theorize about the part-to-whole connections among these given objects. Mereology connects the dots given by ontology. It should not give us reason to introduce further dots for the sake of systematic elegance, which is what the theories rejected in Parts One and Two -- including David Lewis' four-dimensionalist CEM, J.J. Thomson's three-dimensionalist temporalized CEM, and Kit Fine's hylomorphic theory -- seem to do. (One might suggest that Peter van Inwagen, in Material Beings, is guilty of making the same error in the other direction: in order to get a systematic mereology, he removes dots from the ontology.)

This methodology allows that theoretical considerations like systematicity can influence our judgments about the "shape" and "extent" of the web of connections on the dots: we may be moved to introduce (or discover) connections on the basis of such considerations. This is the kind of argument by which Koslicki arrives at her claim that objects have formal, as well as material, parts. Her argument (see pp. 179-81) is roughly this: (1) a lump of clay may constitute a statue without being identical with it; (2) in this situation, the lump is part of the statue, but overlaps every material part of the statue; (3) but, in general, if x is a proper part of y, there must be a z disjoint from x that is also part of y; thus (4) there must be some non-material part of the statue that is disjoint from the lump. Premises (1) and (2) are given prior to mereological theorizing, while (3) is the Weak Supplementation Principle, which, arguably, is a systematic or conceptual truth about the part-whole relation.

Given the general methodology, any part should be an item already given, not a pure postulate of mereology. Koslicki argues that we do have independent reason to recognize structures or formal components as potential parts of objects. Her argument is not compelling, however, for not enough is made clear about the nature of these entities.

Koslicki distances herself from Plato and Aristotle, saying that her formal components come with none of the theological and teleological cobwebs of ancient forms. She then argues at length that we should recognize kinds of things, natural kinds especially, but perhaps others as well. But Koslicki does not put forward kinds themselves as formal components; rather, kinds may be just (distinguished) pluralities of things, and the suggestion is that, associated with each kind, is "a sort of recipe" for making a thing of that kind. The recipe specifies both the sorts of material components, and the arrangement of them, required to create something of that kind. (Koslicki seems to regard the manner by which the components came to be appropriately arranged as irrelevant to the resulting thing's kind; this seems to make Swampman of the same kind as Davidson, and makes an accidental "chair" of the same kind as an artifact.) When an object belongs to a kind, then, its formal components are like the recipe appropriate to that kind: they specify what sorts of material parts it must have, and the required manner of their arrangement.

Suppose we grant that things come in kinds, and that each kind has something like a recipe associated with it. Still, we have been given very little to go on to identify entities which function (individually or jointly) as a recipe. The last chapter of the book is devoted to elucidating a notion of structures that would function this way.

There is a further metaphor: structures "make available" "slots" into which things of certain types may go, and do so in such a way that, by "filling" these slots, certain relationships are thereby required to hold among the things in the slots. For example, here is a certain structure for seating people at a dinner party: the slots are arranged in a circle, as it were, and are to be filled with people, but in such a way that the people alternate by gender, so that each woman (man) is sitting between two men (women). Further, a structure is, by its nature, associated with a class of alterations or transformations on which it is invariant. For example, suppose we have a seating assignment for our dinner party which conforms to the structure just mentioned. Now, that structure is preserved if we switch any of the women with any other woman; the structure is invariant under such switching. But it is not invariant under a switching that switches one man with one woman (assuming there are more than two diners).

Koslicki brings out the fact that the fields of mathematics, logic, chemistry, music theory, and linguistics, each in its own way, use some notion of structure, and of structure-preserving transformations. While there is no denying that the various uses of "structure" in these fields have some similarities, these uses are different enough that the thing-in-common-to-all-of-them would be rather abstract. While the comparison is somewhat suggestive, one does not get a firm grip on what this thing-in-common would be. As Koslicki admits, the overview of the various fields leaves a fair amount open as to what the nature of the structures, taken as entities that are supposed to be the formal components of objects, is: for example, whether they are universals (properties or relations) or particulars (objects). (See section IX.4.)

Too much, it seems to me, is left open. I don't know how to begin to answer the following questions: Is there a formal entity (self-identity, perhaps) that is part of every thing? (Then the Weak Supplementation Principle has to be abandoned; but what about the argument for formal parts?) Does something whose normal development and activity involve internal change, like a cat, have different formal parts at different times over the course of its life? And the problems of giving a systematic theory of such entities, with principles of existence, individuation conditions, principles governing the mereological relations among them, and so forth, are never really engaged.

Nor does Koslicki discuss the concern that recognition of structures as fundamental in mereology will exert theoretical pressure to "add more dots" to the ontology. It is hard not to think of Koslicki's project as including something like the giving of an interesting and explanatory answer to Van Inwagen's "Special Composition Question": under what conditions do some things compose something? (See Material Beings, esp. Chapter Two.) Her answer would seem to be roughly this: the xs compose something when there is a structure associated with a kind, such that the xs include that structure and some things that have that structure, and include nothing else. Now take a problematic structure, like the dinner-party structure or the structure of a trout-turkey (recipe: put in one slot the head of a trout and in a second slot the body and tail of a turkey; then do nothing more -- impose no, or a trivial, constraint on their arrangement). Is there anything in Koslicki's account to explain why things with such a structure do not compose an object (or why there are no such structures, or why, and why it matters ontologically that, there is no kind for such a structure to be associated with)? I doubt that there is, but cannot argue the case here.

Suppose there isn't. The question then is to what extent this is a problem. One might well think it is a problem to the extent that Koslicki's account is supposed to provide something like a positive explanation of why some things compose an object. For if the features that Koslicki identifies are taken to explain, in each case in which some things compose something, why those things compose something, then, by a plausible principle about explanation, we should get that when some things fail to compose something, that feature is absent. (The general principle here is roughly: if, in general, A explains B, then, in general, the presence of A requires the presence of B.) (Cf. Remark Three in Chapter Seven of Material Beings.)

At any rate, if one is moved to keep the ontology "normal" (tables, table-legs, cats, legs of cats, no trout-turkeys) and is also moved by questions of the form "Why do these things compose something while those things don't?" one will not, I think, find satisfying answers in Koslicki's book. Perhaps, as might be entailed by a more radical version of Koslicki's methodological suggestion, such questions are misguided. (Compare Ned Markosian's "Brutal Composition.") And perhaps Koslicki did not see her account as relevant to such questions. But she began by complaining that a main problem with the Standard Conception is that it "sees no difference" between unassembled motorcycle parts and assembled ones; it is natural, as a theorist, to want an explanation, not just an acknowledgment, of the difference.

Philosophers interested in mereological issues will profit from Koslicki's book, despite the lack of specificity about the nature of structures. There are some interesting strands of argument in Koslicki's positive account of composition that I have not mentioned, including one concerning the "Grounding Problem." Here there is room only to acknowledge, not to engage with them.


Chisholm, Roderick. Person and Object. Open Court (1976).

Markosian, Ned. "Brutal composition," Philosophical Studies 92 (1998), pp. 211-249.

van Inwagen, Peter. Material Beings. Cornell University Press (1990).