The Structure of Perceptual Experience

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James Stazicker (ed.), The Structure of Perceptual Experience, Wiley-Blackwell, 2015, 154pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781119061083.

Reviewed by Christopher Mole, University of British Columbia


The philosophy of perception has many parts. Some border on epistemology, some on the philosophy of psychology, and some on enquiries into the metaphysics of consciousness. The volume under review is concerned with the parts relating to perception's structure. Its six papers address the representational status of sense data, the blurriness of blurred vision, the perception of imperative content, the relation of perdurant experiences to their temporal parts, the ways in which audition acquaints us with objective properties, and the differences between sensory modalities in their presentation of space. Questions of structure are central to Louise Richardson's discussion of the contrast between spatial and temporal versions of Molyneux's Question. They are also prominent in Matthew Nudds's discussion of our capacity to recognize auditory events. But for most of the volume 'structure' serves as a broad rubric, under which various research can be collected. The volume is not so specialized as to be of interest only to those with prior expertise in structural questions. It is, nonetheless, a volume for experts. The writers of its blurb describe the volume as "a valuable resource for academics, researchers and scholars". This does not overstate the breadth of its appeal.

Some of the authors position themselves as contributing to a well-established debate between attempts to account for perception by reference to the representational states of a perceiving subject, and attempts to account for it by reference to relations between that subject and the things that she perceives. These terms are well-entrenched in the current literature. The positions that they define can nonetheless be hard to delineate precisely, and so there is work to be done, plotting the contours of the space in which this debate takes place. The volume's first essay exemplifies one of the ways in which such work can be accomplished. Fiona Macpherson asks whether the twentieth century's sense-data theory was on the side of representationalism or relationism. Her answer -- unsurprisingly -- is that it depends what one means by 'representationalism'. Her essay gives a systematic account of the several things that one might mean. It provides a clearly-drawn taxonomy, complete with a precise identification of the dimensions along which the positions in this taxonomy vary. Contributors to these debates should benefit from Macpherson's meticulous work here, even if readers who are not already invested in those debates remain unconvinced of such an investment's profitability.

The debate between representation-based and relation-based theories also provides the context for the second essay, in which Craig French gives an account of visual blurriness from within the framework of a relation-based theory (which he refers to as 'naive-realism'). French takes blurriness to raise a challenge for relation-based theories because it is an aspect of perception's phenomenal character that is not derived from the properties of the things to which one is perceptually related: My vision becomes blurry when I remove my glasses, even when the things to which I am perceptually related remain sharp-edged. Elsewhere in the recent literature blurriness has been treated as a challenge for the representationalist, since blur is -- as French notes -- a feature of their phenomenal character that experiences do not present, or represent, perceived things as having: Sharp things in my environment do not appear to lose their sharpness when I remove my glasses. Their sharpness merely ceases to be seen.

French's solution to these difficulties -- arrived at after rejecting some alternatives that have been assayed elsewhere -- is that blurriness modifies the relation of seeing. Seeing a sharp-edged thing blurrily is, on this view, somewhat like sitting on a chair precariously: The person sitting precariously is not sitting on anything other than the chair, nor doing anything with the chair in addition to sitting on it. Her sitting on the chair is a relation to the chair itself, and not to some representation of it. Her sitting is precarious because it is done in a certain way. Similarly, a person who is seeing blurrily is not seeing anything other than the chair, nor doing anything with the chair in addition to seeing it. His perception of the chair is a relation to the chair itself, and not to some representation of it. His perception is blurry because it is done in a certain way.

One might be persuaded that this is the right form for an account of blurriness to take, without thinking that the resulting account will make blurriness unproblematic for naive realism. If we ask which way of seeing is the blurry way then the representationalists can say that it is a way involving low-precision specifications of location. The naive realists cannot say this (since precision is a property of representations). They must instead follow the line that French suggests when he writes "Maybe blurrily is a sui generis way of perceiving, maybe blurriness is a sui generis modification of consciousness, maybe it can be accounted for in terms of qualia, or sensational properties" (p. 47). That may indeed be so, but saying it offers little in the way of explanation, and so representationalism seems to have an advantage here. More would need to said in order to gauge the magnitude of that advantage. French does not have the room in which to say it, but his dialectic does take us to a point where we can see that what might have appeared to be a decisive objection has been diminished to an abductive consideration.

In the third paper Sebastian Watzl attempts to broaden our conception of perceptual contents, arguing that these include 'guiding contents'. His idea is that perception does not merely tell us how the world is; it also motivates us to act on that world in perceptually-specified ways. Watzl develops this suggestion with reference to three examples: seeing a delicious looking cake, hearing an attention-capturing explosion, and listening to music that invites dancing. His proposal goes beyond J.J. Gibson's suggestion that perception tells us about the actions that our environment affords. It has more in common -- as Watzl explains -- with suggestions that can be found in the work of Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and of those he inspired.

Opponents of Gibson would say that perception presents Watzl's cake only as having certain categorical properties, although these might include properties that are known to make good eating probable. They would say that something in addition to perception is needed for the formulation of a plan in which the cake gets eaten. Gibson rejects this, claiming that the action of eating is already given in perception, as something that the cake affords. Watzl agrees, and makes the further claim that the action of eating is given, not merely as something that could be done, but as something that one is motivated to do: The cake is seen, not merely as brown and shiny, nor merely as moist and sweet. It is not even seen merely as edible. Perception itself presents the cake as to-be-eaten. We can understand Watzl's claim as being that a verbal representation of perception's content would need to be given in a hortative mood (although Watzl himself does not put the point in those terms).

English is not especially rich in hortative moods, and its speakers typically resort to metaphor when trying to convey the phenomenology that Watzl wants to capture: We say that the cake looked like it wanted to be eaten; or that it was saying 'eat me'. A literal-minded monoglot might take this to indicate that Watzl's proposal requires us to see the world as being full of agents, including such strange creatures as cakes with mental states. Watzl carefully explains that his proposal makes no such requirement.

He concludes by suggesting that the need to accommodate what he calls 'guiding content' alongside 'informative content' creates a difficulty, since both kinds of content must be represented by a single experience. This difficulty may be less severe than Watzl suggests. Languages have no difficulty in combining different moods within a single sentence. Consider the sentence "This cake is delicious, so eat some!" To motivate Watzl's problem we would need a reason for thinking that mixed moods are harder to represent in perception than in language.

Nudds contributes the fifth paper, which attempts to assuage some doubts about audition. These doubts can be voiced in a metaphysical or an epistemological tone: We can ask whether sounds, timbres, tones, and pitches aren't rather strange examples of things-in-the-world, or whether audition has the resources to provide knowledge of such things. Here Nudds's approach is epistemological. The problem he addresses can be thought of like this: When our teacher evacuated the air from a bell jar, and showed us that the alarm in it was no longer audible, we learned that audition is the perception of a vibrating medium, and so learned something new. It would have been less surprising if we had been shown that our visual experiences of squareness are caused by items with four sides. We knew that already. Our visual experiences, by themselves, had acquainted us with four-sidedness as such. Our auditory experiences had not given us vibration in the same immediate way. This raises the question of whether audition puts us immediately in touch with the world.

We can, of course, learn about that world by listening. We can learn, by listening, that the flint on a Zippo lighter has just been struck, but this -- as Nudds explains -- is not because the property of being manufactured by the Zippo Company is given in audition. Background knowledge plays an essential role in getting us from an auditory experience to a justified belief about such properties as being manufactured by Zippo. If non-auditory background knowledge always plays a role in enabling hearing to provide knowledge of worldly events, then audition is in an epistemically impoverished position, as compared to vision or touch. The problem is not, on Nudds's understanding, that audition might acquaint us with only subjective properties, but that it might only acquaintance us with properties that leave us unable to bring heard events into the explanatory scope of our 'primitive theory of mechanics'; the result being that audition leaves us unable to make sense of events as 'elements in a material world' (p. 111).

Having explained this problem, Nudds proceeds to solve it. He does so by drawing our attention to auditory perceptions in which we hear temporally-structured events, rather than pure tones or punctate taps. These structured events might include such things as a marble rolling around a bowl before coming to rest. In these cases auditorily-presented structures can incorporate relations that situate heard events within the explanatory theory that we use to make sense of the material world. Nudds makes it plausible that this clears the way for audition to 'put us in contact with the world', much as vision and touch do. Any philosophical essay that solves the puzzles it raises risks creating the impression that we have merely been returned to the unpuzzled state in which we started, but Nudds returns us to it with a fresh appreciation of temporal structure's epistemic importance.

In the final essay Richardson considers differences between sensory modalities as to their presentations of time and space. These are approached via an issue raised by Gareth Evans's discussion of Molyneux's question. Molyneux asked whether persons who had learned to tell cubes from spheres by touch would recognize these shapes on the basis of a first purely visual encounter with them. Evans puzzled over the fact that no philosopher had given a straightforwardly affirmative answer to this question, pointing out how plausible such an answer would be if, rather than shapes, the question were asked about temporal structures. He thought that the person who had learned, by touch alone, to tell pulsating signals from constant ones would readily be able to identify such signals on a first purely auditory encounter with them, simply by applying the concepts that had been learned in the haptic case to the content that was perceived in audition.

If we take it literally then, Molyneux's question seems to be a topic for empirical enquiry, and its answer seems to be 'no', although for reasons -- to do with the abnormal development of an unstimulated visual system -- that are peripheral to the philosophical heart of the matter, as Molyneux and Evans understood it. We get at that heart more directly by considering Molyneux's question as a thought experiment, with which to probe our understanding of perception's modality-specific features. This thought-experimental approach is the one that Richardson takes; using it to bring several of the issues raised by Evans' version of the problem into view.

Richardson refrains from answering the temporal or spatial question on her own behalf. Instead she takes as her explanandum the fact that an affirmative answer has seemed more plausible in the temporal case than in the spatial one. Her essay attempts to locate a reason for this difference, founded in considerations of perceptual phenomenology. We might doubt that there is such a reason. Perhaps Locke thought that a negative answer to Molyneux's question was plausible, not because he was responding to some feature of perceptual phenomenology, but because he was in the grip of a theory. Other philosophers might have been similarly gripped. Richardson's most compelling argument for thinking that there is a phenomenological basis for the difference in plausibility between affirmative answers to the two questions is just that she seems to have located it. Her central claim is that vision presents us with objects as the occupants of some region in which things can be seen, whereas touch presents us with objects as standing in certain spatial relations to the body with which they are touched. Touch therefore presents no analogue of a visual field, and this differentiates the presentation of space in vision from its presentation in touch. Since there is no analogous difference in the modalities' presentations of time, the spatial version of Molyneux's question strikes us as difficult, while the temporal version does not.

Here, as in its other essays, this short volume's space restrictions leave one wishing that more could have been said. (But since the volume had its first incarnation as the special issue of a journal, the imposition of such restrictions is understandable.) In Richardson's essay one would have liked more about the relation between perception of shape and perception of location. One might also have liked more about audition (since it is as a question about audition that Evans's version of Molyneux's question was first raised).

Like Richardson, Thomas Crowther addresses the temporal version of a problem that is more familiar when posed as a problem about space. In Crowther's case the spatial problem is whether and how we see whole space-filling objects, when it is only the proximal surfaces of those objects that contribute to the character of visual experience. The temporal analogue is, he suggests, whether and how it can be true, during some proper temporal part of an experience, that we are directly experiencing an event, but not the whole of that event.

In addressing this puzzle Crowther puts a lot of apparatus on the table. We are told about Davidson's ontology of events, about the debate between representationalists and relationalists, about M.G.F. Martin's account of the contrast between direct and indirect perception, about perfective and imperfective verb aspects, and about controversies surrounding the metaphysics of constitution. The apparatus of which Crowther makes most use is that with which he draws a distinction (to which several philosophers of mind have recently been attracted) between activities and processes; where the latter, but not the former, are understood as requiring that a complete trajectory of phase space be traversed. Seeking one's fortune would be an 'activity', in this sense, but finding or losing it would be a 'process'. Although it seems likely that some puzzling features of perception could be illuminated with an account of this distinction, the illumination provided here is less than complete. With several pieces of apparatus needing to be introduced, explained, and mobilized, it is perhaps inevitable that space constraints get in the way of dialectic clarity. We are rather frequently told that there is more to be said than Crowther's paper can accommodate, and the paper often falls back on the vocabulary of suggestion, rather than entailment or refutation. Problems are left at the stage where things are said to be 'not obvious' or 'not at all clear'; 'worries' are said to have the effect of 'prompting challenges', which in turn raise 'suspicions'. This essay would have been more satisfactory if some smaller picture had been rendered in higher definition, but a number of promising research directions are successfully indicated.

Being the book of a journal's special issue (collecting papers from a workshop that was hosted by the University of Reading in 2013), this is not a volume in which diverse views come together to give a picture that accomplishes more than the sum of its parts. Nor -- as the editor's brief introduction indicates -- does it try to be. The volume nonetheless makes a welcome contribution to the literature. Taken together its papers give us a variety of perspectives on territory where new philosophical ground is currently being explored. They clearly display a number of the subtle issues that have been turned up in the course of this exploration.