The Structure of the World: Metaphysics and Representation

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Steven French, The Structure of the World: Metaphysics and Representation, Oxford University Press, 2014, 394pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199684847.

Reviewed by Alyssa Ney, University of Rochester


Structural realism is a view about the metaphysical conclusions we should draw from our best scientific theories. A version of scientific realism designed to avoid the pessimistic meta-induction, it says that we shouldn't infer any specific ontology of objects bearing intrinsic properties from our best scientific theories since we have good reason to believe any such commitments will be discarded in future theories. Instead, we should only commit to the structure of our best scientific theories since only this has survived the history of theory change.

John Worrall, who developed this view in the 1980s, didn't deny that there were objects bearing intrinsic properties in the world. He thought the reasonable attitude to hold about the nonstructural parts of theories was agnosticism. But in 1998, James Ladyman advocated a more radical position, an ontic structural realism contrasting with Worrall's epistemic view. This said that our best scientific theories give us license to believe that fundamentally all there is to the world are these structures. Ladyman's former teacher, Steven French, himself an influential advocate of ontic structuralism realism (hereafter, OSR), has now written a superb defense of this position.

The big question that has been bugging those not already on the structural realism bandwagon is: what on Earth do they mean by 'structure'? In Worrall's original paper, what he discusses as surviving theory change are laws or equations, describing certain mathematical relationships. Fresnel's law, for example, has survived changes from the discarded ether theory of light through Maxwell's electromagnetism to today's electroweak theory. But although it is natural to fit this nomic or mathematical notion of structure into the picture offered by the epistemic structural realist (there may be objects, we just can't know their intrinsic natures -- all we can know is the mathematical relationships they obey), it is a perplexing notion for one taking the ontic view. How could there be nothing but mathematical relationships? Mustn't there be objects that are the subjects of these relationships?

This is the main question French promises to address. His goal is to take on board the resources of contemporary metaphysics to make clear what is the nature of the world's fundamental structure and, in particular, how it is not mathematical, in order to answer what he calls "Chakravartty's challenge." This is an ontological challenge Anjan Chakravartty (2007) argues is faced by any view purporting to be a version of scientific realism: to give a metaphysically informed, clear picture of the world.

Has French met the challenge in this book? Well, I have to confess the view is more elusive than I would like. But most certainly, we do learn in many respects what his OSR is not. And there is much compelling argument throughout the book against competitor views, especially the dispositionalism that French finds to be the main rival to his version of OSR. This book is incredibly rich, and provides an authoritative source on the in's and out's of the recent debate over OSR.

Perhaps what most distinguishes French is that unlike many structuralists over the past century, he would like to distance himself from the structuralism defended by Bertrand Russell in The Analysis of Matter. Here the structure of the world is a system of relations between objects mirroring the relations between our perceptual experiences caused by those objects. French argues that any structuralism based on this picture of Russell's will have trouble accommodating quantum theory, in particular the lessons of quantum statistics.

Quantum statistics (Bose-Einstein statistics for bosons, Fermi-Dirac statistics for fermions) differs from classical statistics. The difference is most of the time explained by the fact that in quantum theory particles are "identical," often understood as their lacking individuality. They cannot be distinguished by any of their intrinsic or relational features, so can't be distinguished using a principle of the identity of indiscernibles (PII). As early as 1926, Max Born called quantum particles "non-individuals." It is this situation in quantum theory that leads French away from the more common Russellian structuralist ontology.

His version differs first in his insistence that quantum statistics gives us reason to reject the existence of objects. French's OSR is explicitly eliminativist in a way others (e.g., Ladyman's) are not. French goes eliminativist not because he doubts we can make sense of particles as non-individuals; he thinks we probably can. Rather it is because he thinks theory underdetermines the correct metaphysical view to hold about quantum particles. Although many have endorsed the particles as non-individuals conception, F.A. Muller and Simon Saunders (2008) have proposed a way to ground the individuality of quantum particles in a notion they call "weak discernibility." Roughly, particles may be thought of as weakly discernible, and hence classed as individuals according to PII, if there exists some asymmetric relation they bear to each other. For the case of fermions at least (which enter into states describable as ones of opposite spin), this notion of weak discernibility seems a promising way to ground the individuality of quantum particles. Taking this approach seriously (and with optimism about its extension to the case of bosons), French argues that quantum statistics should make us reject objects, because if there were objects, then there would have to be some facts determining whether these things were individuals or not. But, since the physics itself underdetermines which is correct, the particles as non-individuals approach or the particles as individuated by weak discernibility approach, we should prefer an interpretation of the physics that doesn't leave questions like this open. This is to reject the existence of objects (particles) altogether.

This argument will be controversial to many. French is arguing that in situations in which an examination of physics leads to some "epistemic humility" regarding metaphysical natures, it is best to seek an alternative interpretation that removes the source of the humility; in this case, eliminating objects. I say this will be controversial because in general, philosophers do not think that the existence of open questions concerning some entity should make us reject the very existence of that entity. Physics characterizes the properties of the world but doesn't tell us whether they are tropes or universals. But does this mean we should reject the existence of properties? Physics gives us dynamical laws, but doesn't settle the question of whether these laws are reducible to categorical facts (as the Humean thinks) or not. But does this mean we should reject the fact that there are laws? French doesn't think it is reasonable to reject properties or laws, even though he himself grants that these are issues that physics doesn't settle. He rests content with open questions about the nature of properties in Chapter 7 and open questions about the nature of laws in Chapter 9. In these cases, he says he prefers to have a "big tent" attitude. But why be content with humility here? It is not clear what distinguishes the cases. Perhaps French doesn't think it is possible to have a coherent, scientifically-informed metaphysics that does away with properties and laws, but that it is possible to have one that does away with objects. So let's turn to the positive proposal and see what such a view would look like.

As we have seen, French thinks quantum theory should make us reconsider the Russellian conception of structure. What our best theories teach us isn't a lesson about the relational characterization of objects. Instead they give us certain laws. And, they tell us something about the sort of symmetries that characterize our world. This is the second big lesson he advises us to draw from quantum statistics. It is the permutation invariance of quantum systems, a symmetry that like others is represented mathematically by using group theory. So, instead of thinking of the structure of the world as a system of relations, which raises the distressing metaphysical issue of how there could be relations without relata, we should take the structure of the world as primarily what is represented by group theory and, in addition, the physical laws. This extends not just to the permutation group, but to all of the group structure representing the symmetries in our best scientific theories: the U(1)×SU(2)×SU(3) structure of the Standard Model, the Poincaré group representing space-time symmetries, and so on.

This picture raises a host of metaphysical concerns. First, the specter of Pythagoreanism rears its head. If the structure of the world is all there is, and this structure is group-theoretic structure, then how is this not to say that the world is fundamentally mathematical? French devotes a few chapters to this issue (what he calls 'the collapse problem'). His first move is to emphasize a distinction between presentation and representation. Scientific theories present the structure of the world using the resources of group theory, but this isn't to say they are representing this structure as group-theoretic. Next, in perhaps the metaphysically most penetrating chapter of the book, French works to distinguish his position from what is clearly a version of Pythagoreanism, the Mathematical Universe Hypothesis defended by Max Tegmark.

One might try to distinguish mathematical from physical structure by saying the one is abstract while the other is concrete. However, like many metaphysicians today, French despairs of finding a way to give content to this distinction. Another strategy would be to distinguish mathematical from physical structure in modal terms. Mathematics gives us everything that is possible; the physical corresponds only to the part that is actualized. However, French is unsympathetic to this strategy, for he intends his notion of structure to encapsulate not just actuality, but the full range of physical possibilities. As he emphasizes most forcefully in later chapters, his conception of structure is irreducibly modal. To use his favorite example, the group structure encapsulating permutation invariance encodes the full range of actually instantiated types like bosons and fermions, but also types we believe are not actually instantiated, paraparticles types (those that are neither bosonic nor fermionic states). These are aspects of the symmetry group and so, French argues, should be taken to have physical significance. Not the particles, of course. As an eliminativist, French doesn't believe there are such things. But he is a realist about the aspects of the structure corresponding to the representation of paraparticle states.

The way French ultimately prefers to solve the collapse problem is by appeal to causality. He argues that what distinguishes manifested physical structure from mere mathematical structure is that the former is causal. It is endowed with an "active principle." Although he is officially noncommittal on the correct way to understand causality, he is sympathetic with process theories that would ground causal facts in facts about conserved quantities. Given the earlier chapters' emphasis on laws and symmetries and French's move away from viewing structure as a system of relations between objects, it is a bit puzzling where the causality is supposed to be located. He doesn't believe in the entities that would be the seat of causality in standard process theories. Still, he believes the laws and symmetries capture the sort of dependencies that ground explanation. (p. 227). But what are the entities that manifest these causal dependencies?

One natural interpretation would involve bringing back some kind of thin objects to at least serve as the seats of causality, to be the objects that instantiate the causal structure encoded in the laws. This would be to advocate a dispositionalist view, one viewing the properties of objects as inherently causal. French's critique of dispositionalism in this book is too complex to be adequately summarized here, but there are at least two central (and compelling) worries. Both stem from a kind of holism inherent in the relevant physics. First, French notes that the assignment of any remotely compact dispositions to entities would rely on abstracting from the way the behavior of objects is actually determined by the laws; this depends on features in an object's environment. Thus, assignments of dispositions are usually given by imagining what an object would do in certain simple, contrived circumstances where we abstract the complexity of the environment. This gives a metaphysics at some arm's length from the physics, motivated as it is by a priori verdicts about hypothetical scenarios. A second worry is how symmetries would fit into the dispositionalist's picture. French is particularly worried about the conservation laws that are entailed by symmetries via Noether's theorem. It is difficult to see how (say) the fact that total charge is conserved in a closed system may be understood in terms of the individual dispositions of objects. Some dispositionalists have tried to accommodate conservation laws in their framework by postulating dispositions of the whole universe to (for example) maintain a constant value of charge or lepton number (Bigelow, Ellis, and Lierse 1992). But French argues that symmetries and the resulting conservation laws are more naturally captured within the framework of OSR.

It is clear French's version of the view takes laws and symmetries to be the central metaphysical elements of structure. But this raises two questions. First, what are laws and symmetries according to French? And second, could this be all that fundamentally exists? With respect to the first question, this book could have benefited from including a primer on group theory as well as a clear statement of French's metaphysical interpretation of the symmetries these groups are used to represent, as well as a definitive statement of how he thinks of laws. In many places,French says the structure of the world consists in laws and symmetries. And since this book is a defense of OSR, it is then natural to conclude that all French thinks there is fundamentally are laws and symmetries. But then to have a clear metaphysics, we would need to know what these things are and how they could be everything.

Start with symmetries. Symmetries are represented in physics using groups, which are standardly represented as sets. But French wants to emphasize that even though groups are presented using set theory, we shouldn't take symmetries themselves to be mathematical. So then what are the groups representing? The typical way to conceive of symmetries is in terms of transformations on a system that make no difference according to the laws: reflections, translations, velocity boosts, permutations of objects. But this interpretation of symmetries threatens to make symmetries ontologically dependent on objects, undermining French's eliminativism. So there must be some other way of understanding the symmetries French takes to partly constitute the world's structure. (Here, French would likely appeal to a strategy he calls "Poincaré's maneuver." This is to acknowledge that our conceptual access to symmetries tends to run through a consideration of objects, but to insist that this psychological fact should not be viewed as authoritative with respect to the underlying metaphysics. This is fair enough, but in order to answer Chakravartty's ontological challenge, French should be able to offer some alternative, non-object-based conception of symmetries as a way of coming to grips with them.)

In Chapter 6, French explores two ways of thinking about the relationship between symmetries and laws. One is to think of symmetries as providing constraints on the laws, on the kind of behavior we could expect to see at this world. The other is to see symmetries as byproducts of the laws. In the latter case, laws are more fundamental than symmetries, in which case French's OSR would seem to boil down to the view that fundamentally there are only laws. So, we should ask how French is thinking of the laws. Very little is said on this topic, but in places we find the claim that laws are relations. But relations between what?

Ultimately it seems that there must be more to the world than what French countenances as structure. This seems clear from his glosses on how he is thinking about laws. But anyway, we need more than laws and symmetries simply to capture the fact that physics does not merely postulate laws and symmetries, but also makes predictions about specific features of the world we observe. This involves assignments of specific values of quantities at particular places at particular times. French appeals again to group theory in order to explain how these states too may be structural. He considers a couple of strategies. When it comes to many features (mass, spin, momentum), possible precise states will correspond to irreducible unitary representations of the Poincaré group. Quark color may emerge as an irreducible representation of the SU(3) group of quantum chromodynamics. There is a worry here that the same group representations are used to represent distinct states, for example, the several quark flavors. In these cases, French proposes an alternative maneuver, understanding individual quantities in terms of spontaneous symmetry breaking. To defend OSR, he speculates that each case of spontaneous symmetry breaking may involve a "breaking" of a system from one symmetry group down to another.

Here, too, an explicit explanation and interpretation of the group-theoretic notions deployed would have been useful. French explains that particular group representations may be viewed as ways of structuring the Hilbert space of a system. But then it looks like part of the fundamental ontology comprises vectors in a Hilbert space, or whatever entities these vectors represent. And one wants to know what these are and whether they can be given a purely structural interpretation.

At times it seems French is less committed to an all-out ontic structural realism than others like Ladyman and Don Ross. For example, unlike Ladyman and Ross (2007, Chapter 3), he does not seem particularly inclined to extend structuralism to space-time. He suggests structuralism about space-time is just one among many options. Indeed, considering the assignment of specific values of quantities, French says that we need not take all elements to be structural and that the core of his OSR is mainly a structuralism about "objects" (p. 201). But then this is a very different view than that descending from the line of Worrall and Ladyman, which is primarily influenced by having the "best of both worlds": a view which can endorse the arguments for scientific realism while avoiding the pessimistic meta-induction. Ultimately this is a structural realism that seems more motivated by a rejection of objects for metaphysical reasons, rather than a commitment to only what is preserved through theory change. One can't see objects as entities with some kind of determinate natures. And if we try to maintain objects by understanding them in some other way, in terms of causal properties characterized by the laws, we end up distorting the physics.

In the end, those wanting to know what the world is like according to French's distinctive group-theory-motivated OSR will still have some questions. Nonetheless, this is an extremely rich and fascinating book, well-worth reading and including far more topics than I've been able to recount in this review, including a history of structuralism in physics from Poincaré through Cassirer, Weyl, and Wigner, a defense of the partial structures approach to scientific representation, an investigation of the prospects for OSR in the context of quantum field theory, and an application to biology. French gives us compelling reasons to think a metaphysical position informed by physics should be suspicious of objects with either intrinsic or dispositional natures. As for what positively it should include, we are still at the beginning of an important and fascinating discussion.


Bigelow, John, Brian Ellis, and Caroline Lierse. 1992. The World as One of a Kind: Natural Necessity and Laws of Nature. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science. 43:371-388.

Chakravartty, Anjan. 2007. A Metaphysics for Scientific Realism. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Ladyman, James. 1998. What is Structural Realism? Studies in History and Philosophy of Science. 29: 409-424.

Ladyman, James, Don Ross, et. al. 2007. Every Thing Must Go: Metaphysics Naturalized. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Muller, F.A. and Simon Saunders. 2008. Discerning Fermions. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science. 59: 499-548.

Worrall, John. 1989. Structural Realism: The Best of Both Worlds? Dialectica. 43: 99-124.