The Struggle Against Dogmatism: Wittgenstein and the Concept of Philosophy

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Oskari Kuusela, The Struggle Against Dogmatism: Wittgenstein and the Concept of Philosophy, Harvard University Press, 2008, 351pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674027718.

Reviewed by Marie McGinn, University of York


One of the most perplexing, and to some irritating, aspects of Wittgenstein's later philosophy is his apparent insistence that he is not putting forward philosophical theses, or making any claim with which others could possibly disagree or which it is possible to dispute. It can be hard to see how this can be understood as anything other than an attempt by Wittgenstein to privilege his own conceptions of meaning or of psychological phenomena, or as a claim to the absolute and indisputable correctness of his observations on rules, understanding, sensations, the propositions of mathematics, and so on. The idea that Wittgenstein's later philosophy is in some way implicitly dogmatic has been encouraged by interpretations, such as the one developed in great detail by Peter Hacker and Gordon Baker in their commentary on the Philosophical Investigations, which hold that Wittgenstein does not put forward theses insofar as he is merely describing the rules for the use of expressions; his remarks are held to be indisputable insofar as anyone who understands the relevant expressions must agree to Wittgenstein's descriptions, and recognize that any deviation from them inevitably results in nonsense. On this conception of it, the kind of conceptual investigation that Wittgenstein is engaged in results in the articulation of the grammatical rules implicit in our use of expressions, and provides a base from which unanswerable criticisms of the use that philosophers make of the expressions of our language can be mounted. Wittgenstein's idea that his aim is to make philosophical problems 'completely disappear' is, on this interpretation, taken to be equivalent to an intention to show that they one and all depend upon a demonstrably deviant, and therefore nonsensical, employment of words.

In the late 1990s, Gordon Baker came to believe that the approach that he and Hacker had taken to Wittgenstein's later philosophy was fundamentally misconceived, and he began to develop an interpretation that departed radically from the one presented in their commentary. Oskari Kuusela was a pupil of Gordon Baker's and he shares his conviction that the later philosophy can only be understood if Wittgenstein's struggle to avoid precisely the sort of dogmatism that characterizes the approach he took with Hacker in their commentary is made absolutely central to it. Kuusela's book may be seen, at least in part, as a continuation of Baker's project to provide a critique of interpretations that fail to recognize that the key to understanding Wittgenstein's later thought lies in appreciating that his principal concern is to overcome the urge to dogmatize in philosophy. Pace Hacker, statements that our use of a particular expression is governed by a given rule, or that a given rule for the use of a word represents the bounds of sense, constitute substantial, and therefore questionable, philosophical claims; attributing such statements to Wittgenstein goes against the rejection of philosophical dogmatism which, according to Baker and Kuusela, defines his later approach to philosophy. It is hard to imagine a more subtle, careful or rigorous working out of what goes wrong when interpreters fall into extracting from Wittgenstein's text claims about how a word must be used, about how philosophy must be done, about what can or cannot be said, and so on. However, Kuusela's aim is not only to show how such interpretations miss what is most original and fundamental in Wittgenstein's later work, but also to present an alternative account of what the later Wittgenstein means when he says that he is not advancing philosophical theses.

Although Kuusela's principal concerns are with the interpretation of the later philosophy, he shares Cora Diamond's view that to understand the later philosophy you need to understand the nature of Wittgenstein's criticisms of the Tractatus, and how he responds to what he sees as the problems with his own early work. He argues that Hacker's misreading of the later work begins in a misunderstanding of the early work, and of the way in which Wittgenstein believes it goes wrong. It is not only that Hacker's view that Wittgenstein shifts from a realist to an anti-realist conception of necessity, or from believing that the rules that govern the use of expressions are hidden and need to be brought out by analysis to the idea that they are fully manifest in our everyday use of words, misrepresents both the early and the later philosophy. It is also that, having failed to identify the kind of criticism Wittgenstein later makes of the Tractatus, Hacker also fails to see how the interpretation of the later work that he develops repeats the very errors that Wittgenstein detects in his early work and is struggling to overcome. Kuusela agrees with Diamond that Wittgenstein believes the real problem with the Tractatus is not that it attempts to ground what are seen as the essential features of language in essential features of reality, but that it is committed to the idea of an essence of representation, that is, to the idea that there is a once and for all answer to the question what the logical order of any language in which thoughts about the world are expressed must be. It is the dogmatism of his early thought that Wittgenstein is later critical of and which he is responding to in the methodological developments which, according to Kuusela, define the shift to the later work. The fundamental problem with Hacker's approach to the later philosophy, Kuusela argues, is that it remains wedded to a conception of language and of philosophical investigation, which, from the early 1930s onwards, Wittgenstein is self-consciously attempting to shed.

Kuusela offers his own distinctive and compelling account of the reflections that lead Wittgenstein from his early dogmatism to the undogmatic approach of the later work. In the Tractatus, Kuusela argues, Wittgenstein attempts to find a solution to all philosophical problems once and for all, by solving what he sees as the single fundamental problem: the problem of the essence of a proposition. The solution to the fundamental problem finds its expression in the general form of a proposition, which determines in advance what form the analysis of any proposition must take. The conception of the correct method of philosophy, which Wittgenstein describes in 6.53, is a dogmatic claim that philosophy must take the form of a critique of language, and that this critique must take the form of an analysis of propositions into truth-functions of elementary propositions that are concatenations of simple names. Insofar as all philosophical problems arise out of a misunderstanding of the logic of language, Wittgenstein believes that in articulating this conception of philosophy, and the method of analysis on which it rests, he has thereby solved, in essentials, all the problems of philosophy. Kuusela argues that, although the Tractatus has broken with a metaphysical tradition that assumes it is possible to state in a proposition what the essence of a proposition is, Wittgenstein remains committed to the idea that propositions have a shared nature, which can be expressed in the form of a variable, which determines in advance what form the analysis of any proposition must take, and which provides the foundation for his conception of the nature of philosophy. One of the problems with Hacker's version of the later philosophy is that it merely conceives of the logic -- or grammar -- of our language as more complex than Wittgenstein had supposed in the Tractatus; Hacker remains committed to the idea that our language has an implicit grammatical structure that it is the task of philosophy to elucidate, to the claim that all philosophical problems can be dissolved by making the grammar of our concepts clear, and to the idea that Wittgenstein's conception of philosophy is grounded in, and justified by, a conception of the essence of language .

Kuusela's aim is to show that the later philosophy is motivated by a concern to avoid any dogmatic claim about what philosophy is, about how it must be done, about the essence of a given concept, or about how expressions must be used. He does not dispute that Wittgenstein's aim is to dissolve philosophical problems by coming to understand the uses or roles of the expressions of our language. However, he claims that there is no attempt to ground or justify this philosophical approach by appeal to a conception of the essence of language. He argues that Wittgenstein's remarks on the practice of philosophy are to be understood as describing nothing more than how he proceeds, and that he does not attempt to ground or justify his procedure; the test of it lies entirely in its power to dispel particular philosophical problems and eliminate particular philosophical paradoxes. In the early 1930s, Kuusela argues, Wittgenstein came to realize that the possible uses of language are far too complex to be captured in any particular set of rules. However, this does not mean that the task of clarification in which he is engaged does not involve articulating rules for the use of expressions, rather it means that Wittgenstein now recognizes the status of the rules that he articulates: the rule -- for example, 'the meaning of a word is its use in the language' -- serves as a prototype, that is, as a model or way of presenting an aspect of our use of words, for example, of how we use the word 'means'. There is no longer any suggestion that the rule covers all uses of the relevant expression, rather the rule is put forward as an object of comparison, as something which can be used to shed light on our actual use of a word by means of both similarities and dissimilarities. The dogmatism of the Tractatus, Kuusela claims, consists in taking what is merely a method of presenting the object of investigation -- the idea of a proposition as a picture -- for the object of investigation itself, and projecting what are merely essential properties of the model onto reality. For Kuusela, the key to the transition from the early to the later philosophy lies in Wittgenstein's recognition of the role of prototypes, examples and analogies in philosophy: they provide a way of looking at things that can be used to throw a new light on our use of concepts. There is no claim that these objects of comparison provide correct descriptions of a system of grammatical rules that is held to govern our employment of expressions; rather they are used to relieve the mental cramps caused by an entrenched way of looking at things; it is a matter of using one representation of the use of language to combat the pathological effects of another. That's why Wittgenstein can give up a particular representation of the use of a word, with which someone disagrees, and employ some other object of comparison: there never was a claim that a rule that Wittgenstein articulates is one by which speakers of the language proceed, or that it defines the absolute limits of sense.

Kuusela works out this account of the later philosophy, and how it emerges from Wittgenstein's criticisms of the Tractatus, in great detail and with careful attention to the scholarly evidence provided by the Nachlass. He focuses particularly on the question whether Wittgenstein is committed to any essentialist claims about language, for example, that it is essentially rule-governed, or that a word has a meaning only insofar as it has a rule-governed use. He tries to show that Wittgenstein does not make any claim about the necessary conditions for meaning, but merely offers a characteristic picture of a word's meaning that helps us overcome the problems created by a referentialist conception. He also considers whether the later Wittgenstein is committed to a particular -- conventionalist -- view of the nature of necessity, and again argues that he remains philosophically neutral on the source of necessity. The idea that necessary connections are grammatical conventions is, it is argued, merely a clarifying model, or object of comparison, that can be used to shed light on our use of statements of necessity. He tries to show that it is precisely by not taking sides in any philosophical dispute that Wittgenstein's method offers the hope of doing justice to the immensely complex phenomenon that is our linguistic practice, and of achieving clarity about various aspects of our everyday life with language that are the focus for philosophical problems and paradoxes. Overall the book articulates and defends a conception of Wittgenstein's philosophy very far removed from the one put forward by Hacker and Baker in their commentary; one on which Wittgenstein's relation to contemporary philosophical thought becomes both more complex and more indirect. Important aspects of the conception are, as Kuusela acknowledges, already familiar in the literature, but by focusing so precisely on the question of dogmatism and what Wittgenstein means by saying that he does not put forward any philosophical theories or explanations, Kuusela has undertaken an important clarificatory task, and the story he tells represents a real contribution to the discussion of how Wittgenstein's philosophy is to be interpreted.