The Stubborn System of Moral Responsibility

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Bruce N. Waller, The Stubborn System of Moral Responsibility, MIT Press, 2015, 294pp., $38.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262028165.


Reviewed by Seth Shabo, University of Delaware


This book is a spirited and engaging broadside against ordinary belief in moral responsibility. Specifically, Bruce Waller challenges the entrenched belief that people bear the kind of moral responsibility for their conduct that would justify punishing them on the grounds that they deserve it. What needs explaining, in Waller's view, is why so many philosophers continue to defend this orthodoxy in the face of such powerful counterevidence. His proposed explanation encompasses a range of psychological and social factors that powerfully reinforce this belief. These include the animal impulse to strike back when harmed, an impulse that often inhibits deeper reflection into the causes of the offender's conduct; the desire to justify expressions of this strike-back impulse; the broader belief in a just universe in which wrongdoers have retribution coming to them; a heuristic tendency to substitute simpler problems for hard ones (in this case, the question of how we can correctly attribute bad qualities to people with the intractable problem of how people can truly deserve punishment); and the ascendancy of an individualistic, neoliberal political culture that downplays the role of societal conditions in shaping how people turn out.

Perhaps the most memorable member of this ensemble is what Waller calls "the Boojum of Creeping Exculpation." The idea is that philosophers have been spooked by the prospect that our growing knowledge of the precise causes and circumstances of human action will require us to extend the recognized categories of excuse, such as duress, insanity, accident, and nonculpable ignorance, to more and more actions, until everything we do is subsumed under one of these categories.

Waller is right to dismiss this worry as unfounded: whatever else, there is no danger of these conditions swallowing up human action in its entirety. It's less clear, however, whether this is indeed the worry to which most contemporary defenders of moral responsibility are responding. For many theorists, it seems, the concern is not that our recognized excuses as such would generalize, but that the best unifying account of these excuses -- the best account of what gives them their exculpating force -- would generalize. For example, it might be argued that the morally relevant feature of the various excuses is that they deprive us of the reasonable opportunity to avoid wrongdoing, and that determinism, if true, would universally deprive us of this opportunity. This worry persists even after the Boojum has been dispatched, and it isn't clear on what grounds Waller might dismiss it as unfounded, as opposed to meriting a serious response.

Be this as it may, one of Waller's main criticisms of the moral responsibility system is worth considering alongside the Boojum worry. The criticism begins with the observation that operating within this system makes it remarkably easy to blame people for their misdeeds and poor choices, without regard to what may well have been insurmountable obstacles to doing better in their actual circumstances. Such obstacles include the effects of grinding poverty, temporary "ego depletion," the greater difficulty some have in shifting from "fast" and effortless to "slow" and strenuous thinking, an impoverished sense of one's efficacy as an agent, and psychologically damaging formative circumstances. When such factors are present, blaming someone without taking them into account can certainly seem sanctimonious, arbitrary, or even perverse. Yet Waller observes that the moral responsibility system doesn't readily accommodate these factors; instead, it tends to treat eligibility for blame and punishment as a "plateau" on which everyone who possesses the requisite competencies stands. Insofar as the usual aim of philosophical accounts is to identify these competencies and to justify attributions of moral responsibility in light of them, it isn't obvious how these accounts will accommodate cases in which it seems downright unrealistic to expect people to have done better in their circumstances despite possessing these competencies. Although the claim would need further elaboration, Waller might plausibly contend that treating these circumstances as mitigating factors doesn't seem entirely satisfactory.

This is undoubtedly an important concern for both ordinary thought and philosophical theorizing about moral responsibility. Yet its force is somewhat difficult to gauge, for two reasons. First, as will be seen, there is more than one way to flesh out the concern, and Waller doesn't make it entirely clear which way he has in mind. Second, Waller doesn't examine what resources theorists have for addressing the concern, however it is fleshed out.

One way to develop the concern would be to emphasize how ironic and unfair it seems that the moral responsibility system makes few allowances for these obstacles, when fairness is supposed to be the cornerstone of this system. Even if we don't always face the relevant obstacles when we act badly or choose poorly, so that we cannot conclude on this basis that no one is ever morally responsible, it will nonetheless be a stinging indictment of the moral responsibility system if it fails to make due allowances for these cases.

A second way to develop the concern involves seeing such cases as the thin edge of a wedge. The objection would then be that once we appreciate the significance of these obstacles, we should see that there are always obstacles -- frequently more subtle but no less insurmountable -- in light of which people cannot realistically do better than they actually do. This development of the objection would make it analogous to the Boojum worry, except that the upshot wouldn't be that the standardly recognized excuses generalize (we don't always act under duress, from ignorance, and so on), but rather that we are never to blame because it's never realistic to expect us to do better in our precise circumstances, given our growing understanding of human psychology. Since seeing people as morally responsible anyway requires "squinting" hard enough to obscure some of the actual causes of their actions, the moral responsibility system should be rejected.

Whichever way the concern is fleshed out, two observations seem relevant. First, Waller's paradigm case of nonresponsibility seems to be one in which someone faces serious obstacles to figuring out the right thing to do. But many cases in which we are most strongly inclined to blame or punish people aren't like this; rather, they involve people who know perfectly well that what they are doing is wrong. If we focus not on someone who makes poor life choices due to the demoralizing effects of long-term poverty, but on people who arrogantly seek to "punish" those who would curb their gross abuses of authority for as long as they can get away with it, we are apt to be less sympathetic, and our reactions to these cases must be taken into consideration as well.

Second, it may be that theorists of moral responsibility haven't provided good answers to Waller's line of argument because they are most fundamentally concerned with a different question. Consider compatibilists about determinism and moral responsibility. While these theorists do wish to defend ordinary attributions of moral responsibility, their primary concern is to defuse the threat from determinism. Geared as they are toward this threat, it isn't surprising that their accounts don't straightforwardly address Waller's concern about the many hardships and obstacles that individuals face. As to what resources these accounts have for addressing this concern, how satisfactory those resources are, and how damaging any residual difficulties are, these are all questions that merit further examination.

Along with attempting to explain why belief in moral responsibility is so entrenched, Waller devotes some attention both to the practical implications of rejecting this belief, and to showing that he can preserve some of the attractions of the moral responsibility system. Of particular interest in the first connection is his discussion of the reactive attitudes, such as resentment and moral indignation, which many see as manifestations of moral blame. Waller holds that we should not view these attitudes as morally objectionable or inappropriate in themselves, but that we should reject the retaliatory behavior in which they are often expressed. Put simply, while the attitudes have an important place in our moral and emotional lives, they aren't good guides to behavior.

This nuanced position puts Waller at odds with two camps. One rejects blame and punishment in part because these practices express the reactive attitudes, which they see as inherently morally objectionable. The other sees these practices as legitimate because they are, at root, expressions of these eminently natural human reactions. Further elaboration of Waller's position would presumably involve distinguishing acceptable from unacceptably punitive or retaliatory expressions of these attitudes, provided that some behavioral manifestations of these attitudes are indeed acceptable. Such an elaboration would be a welcome contribution to the literature.

With regard to the attractions of the moral responsibility system that Waller seeks to preserve, he provides an intriguing answer to the question of why alternative possibilities might be deemed important, even when one course of action is clearly preferable to the alternatives. His answer focuses on the value, both individually and evolutionarily, of sometimes moving off the beaten track. Here, however, it isn't always clear to what extent he is genuinely engaging the views of the philosophers whose work he cites, since he doesn't expressly relate his use of the crucial phrase "alternative possibilities" to theirs. The same is true of some of his expressly critical discussions of others' views: it isn't always clear to what extent he is genuinely critiquing their accounts as opposed to using them as springboards for his own views. At other times, however, his criticisms of existing accounts are finely honed and instructive.

Altogether, Waller has provided a richly insightful and highly readable (if occasionally strident) look at why belief in moral responsibility persists. It should have wide appeal, even among philosophers who continue to see the belief's overall plausibility as the main reason why it persists, despite whatever doubts and misgivings they may have about it. To move the dial with these readers, Waller will likely need to regiment his arguments more fully and precisely than he does here. In particular, he will need to say more about the norms of desert, and about why we should accept that the considerations he adduces show that people never truly deserve punishment. One question that arises is how he understands the relationship between deserving moral blame and deserving punishment. By Waller's lights, would someone who expresses resentment in protesting a wrong count as morally blaming the object of this sentiment? If so, would the protest be pro tanto morally objectionable or discreditable? Or would Waller deny that it counts as moral blame, or at least as an objectionable form of moral blame?

Perhaps he would say that such moral blame is objectionable for much the same reason that punishment is. If so, however, this is something that would need to be worked out in detail. By not doing so, Waller leaves room for defenders of the moral responsibility system to argue that, whatever else, moral blame is sometimes deserved, and that a key element of the moral responsibility system thus remains unscathed. As it is, Waller seems to focus more on showing why others' attempts to secure genuine blameworthiness fail, perhaps supposing that the onus is on defenders of moral responsibility, than on setting out a case against blameworthiness. In addition to saying more about the norms of desert, such a case would need to incorporate Waller's views about the reactive attitudes.

Be this as it may, Waller's attempt to explain away our belief in moral responsibility is original and often deeply insightful. It is not only empirically well informed but also concretely humanly grounded. This grounded perspective is one to which philosophers who grapple with these issues would certainly do well to attend.