The Subject of Experience

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Galen Strawson, The Subject of Experience, Oxford University Press, 2017, 336 pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199777885.

Reviewed by Paul F. Snowdon, University College London


Galen Strawson's new book consists of fourteen essays written since the late 1990's, which present his rich, fascinating and evolving thoughts about what he calls 'the self' or, as the title of the book has it, the subject of experience. He suggests that one need not read them in order, which is true, but it is striking that reading them in their presented order gives a strong sense of a multifaceted and interlocking theory supported by a variety of arguments and considerations. It would also be fair, I think, to say that the discussion is so rich and draws on such an impressive list of allegedly supporting sources (including the western philosophical tradition, Eastern thought, phenomenology, ancient and modern literature, plus his own self-observation) that it is not entirely easy to pick out what one might call Strawson's central arguments. Strawson perhaps signals as much when he says (on page 35) 'I have been arguing -- if that's the word -- . . . ' He writes throughout as a self-confessed metaphysician exploring the fundamental structure of the world, or, perhaps better, aiming to discover those basic features required by and for the presence of experiences and things having experiences.

The book begins with an important chapter which attempts to convey some insights about, first, experience itself (we all know what it is, it is not mysterious, it is a basic feature of the physical world); and, second, about subjects (there are different conceptions of the subject, with one--the minimal one--a conception that ties the existence of the subject to the occurrence of its experience). Strawson is tempted to describe this conception as 'the most fundamental way of conceiving of the subject' (p. 8). Next comes the seminal paper 'The Self', in which practically everything that follows is introduced (to some degree of detail). Strawson thinks that he and many others have a sense of being a self, which means, roughly, being a mental thing distinct from other things, a 'conscious feeler and thinker', a unified thing, and a thing that in its nature need not, and does not, last long, being there for what Strawson calls a 'hiatus-free' period of experience. He also presents his positive account of materialism. The view normally called by that name amounts, he says, to eliminativism, (p. 23), whereas his view is, to summarise it in my words, that experiential character is irreducible and real and part of what drives the universe along, as other basic physical forces do. He also introduces his opposition to the idea that selves must entertain narratives (p. 32). He ends by affirming that there are and that we are selves. Chapter 3 is Strawson's amazingly even-tempered and detailed response to the crowd of critics who discussed the previous chapter in a special edition of the Journal of Consciousness Studies. Strawson's response is to amplify his own presentation, indicating where his critics have misunderstood him. These first three chapters contain Strawson's central metaphysical proposals.

Next, Strawson engages in uprooting some bad ideas, as he sees them, about ourselves. In chapter 4, a paper written for a conference on the work of his father P. F. Strawson, his target is what he calls corporism, characterised as 'an excessive fixation on the body', in, I hasten to add, theorising about ourselves. An important idea that emerges in this essay (p. 81) is that our use of 'I' exhibits a genuine ambiguity and can refer to the human being but can also refer to the self, as characterised by Strawson, present at the time of thought or speech. In the next chapter, Strawson's thesis is to defend his conviction that, as he puts it, 'if . . . I ask myself whether I'd rather be alive than dead tomorrow morning, . . .I find that after reflection I have no preference either way.' (p. 92) Strawson regards this attitude to the prospect of death as defensible without appeal to his claim that he is a self. In chapters 6 and 7, his target is the idea that human life and existence is in some way constituted by our construction of narratives about ourselves. He helpfully distinguishes different versions of this idea. Some include narrativity in the analysis of what continued life is, while others merely recommend narrativity as a good thing; but Strawson claims that for many lives there is no truth in any of these ideas.

From the next three chapters, I want to pick out three central claims. Clearly, if we are thinking about subjects of experience, it is desirable to say something about the category of experience itself. The central claim that Strawson advances and tries to formulate with great care is that the distinctive and essential thing about experience is that it is "self-intimating: it's reflexive on itself, self-intentional, genuinely 'of' itself " (p. 163). Strawson thinks that this comes close to capturing a deep and central feature of what is distinctive of experience. Second, he proposes that wherever there is an experience there must be a subject. Experience in its nature is an experiencing by a subject. This claim has the status of an obvious necessary truth. Third, he defends the thesis that selves as he conceives of them are objects, by linking the idea of objects to that of being unities, together with the claim that the existence condition for selves, in terms of short-lived experiences, has the consequence that selves are as unified as anything can be. Chapter 11 presents Strawson's account of the nature of first-person thought. He argues in a fuller way than before that 'I' is ambiguous and allows the user to pick out the human being, but also allows the user to refer to the short-lived self that he or she also is. There is, according to him, nothing contrary to the semantics of 'I' in allowing this referential duality.

In the final three chapters, Strawson gives his characteristically radical interpretation of two of the great figures who have written about the self, namely Locke and Hume. He argues that Locke has been almost universally misinterpreted and that he did not propose an analysis of personal persistence in terms of memory, but rather was analysing the extent of an individual's responsibility. In the final two essays, Strawson looks at Hume. According to Strawson, Hume is not claiming that he does not meet 'a self', in some sense of 'meet'. Crucially, he is saying that we do not meet a self which presents itself as independent of the experience then had. In the final chapter, Strawson considers Hume's renunciation of his earlier view. Strawson argues that what Hume had seen is that his overall explanatory project requires a substantial notion of the subject to ground the psychological laws that he is trying to discover but that as a sceptic he cannot affirm the existence of such subjects. Whether that is what Hume had seen when considering his own views or not, it is clearly a problem for Hume's overall project, and Strawson presents it well.

I will have failed in this summary if the reaction to learning Strawson's central views is not, for many, one of a fair degree of incredulity. But my summary certainly does fail to convey both the extraordinary richness (and density) of Strawson's discussion and the care he takes in expounding and clarifying his views. Reading these essays is an exciting, provoking and frequently educational experience.

How, though, should we react to these ideas? I want first to pick out one area where the direction of Strawson's thought seems plausible to me. There is, no doubt, some exaggeration in his highly critical treatment of the notion of narrativity, but Strawson seems to be on the side of the angels in this debate about the extent to which reference to self-narratives illuminate our nature. It seems fairly obvious that the content of our self-narratives cannot be used to define our persistence conditions, or what we are genuinely like, because our self-narratives are themselves to be assessed for accuracy given an independent understanding of what constitutes our lives and the truth about those of us living those lives. The basic problem is to say what living a life is. Obviously, also, we do internalise narratives about ourselves, but self-narratives are no more central to our lives as the kind of creatures that we are than what we might call our narratives about our environment, about others, about the past, and about mathematics (to name but a few dimensions of our cognition, and hence narrative construction).

Another, more disputable, element in Strawson's metaphysics is his version of materialism. Strawson says that he is a physicalist (p. 4), by which he means 'there is one fundamental kind of stuff', which is the subject matter of physics' (p. 4). Strawson in saying this is trying to be cautious, but even so the slogan is somewhat opaque. However, leaving his slogan aside, he adds the indisputable claim that experience is real. He then adds the principle that there is no radical emergence in nature (p. 5) His idea is that if experience emerged through developments in physical processes where the basic components of those physical processes are non-experiential, which is the standard recent view, that would require radical emergence. He concludes that 'experientiality is one. . . basic . . . feature of physical stuff ' (p. 5) The weakness, as I see it, in this line of reasoning is that that unless we have some other reason for being sure that experiences are not in their nature things which are exhaustively constituted by complex combinations of what are considered in their individual nature non-experiential, then the theory that that is what they are does not imply that there has been radical emergence in any objectionable way. If Strawson has no reason to rule out what can be called reductive materialism, then he is not entitled to describe, rather provocatively, the reductive materialist as an 'eliminativist', a description which simply means that the ordinary materialist denies there are experiences as conceived by Strawson. Reductive materialists could, if they wished, describe Strawson as an eliminativist, since he denies there are experiences as they conceive of them. I am not myself here suggesting that reductive materialism is correct, but merely that Strawson provides no reason to think it is false. It can also be asked, though, whether this really matters. Conceding that reductive materialism is true, Strawson could, as far as I can see, still endorse, in whatever sense he does endorse, the thin conception of the self, and everything else that he says. Strawson thinks that his remarks on materialism have the importance of being true, but they do not seem to have the importance of being required for the rest of what he says.

The question that this leads us to is: what exactly is the rest of what Strawson wants to say about subjects (or selves)? Early on, he says that there are three conceptions of subjects: first, the 'thick' way which identifies subjects with (whole) human beings; second, the traditional inner conception, which identifies subjects with something less than the whole human being, say, the brain; and, third, the 'thin' conception according to which the subject only exists when there is an experience going on (see p. 7). About these conceptions, Strawson says they all have 'legitimate and important uses' (p. 8). By a 'legitimate' use he does not mean use as concepts in formulating theories, but rather that they are concepts which have an application to real things. Strawson is therefore a pluralist about subjects. Connected to me now is one thick subject, one, or perhaps more 'inner' subjects, and at least one (but, it could be more, who knows) thin subjects. Now, both this pluralist attitude and the list are odd, though oddity is not necessarily falsity. Normally, people who endorse the so-called inner conception think of themselves as denying for good reasons a mistaken thick conception, and vice versa. Strawson needs to present quite a lot to persuade most of us that this sense of competition is wrong. But, further, the list is an odd one. The first two conceptions say what the subject is, whereas the third merely says how long it lasts. Clearly, to say how long a subject lasts does not remove or block the reasonable, indeed rather fundamental, question: what is the subject? With that specified, the list would make more sense. What is Strawson's answer? The answer he favours is that the subject of an experience is the experience. He calls this the Subject of Awareness/Awareness Identity thesis (p. 196). This identity thesis does explain the claim about the duration of the subject. But we have to swallow some weird consequences. We have to say that an experience has an experience. Not only is it an experience, it has one. But equally, it seems to follow that the subject has a subject. Strawson quotes various distinguished metaphysicians of the past who say things like this, but that cuts both ways. Does that make the view seem sensible, or the traditional thinkers rather silly?

Having arrived at this point I want, in conclusion, to voice two of the many further questions that demand attention. First, if Strawson wants to say that the thin subject is the experience, what exactly is the force of saying that the experience has a subject? Strawson at this point reaches for what some philosophers have said. For example, Frege said that experience needs an experiencer (p. 167). To which one might say; why believe Frege on this matter? Moreover, that remark does not answer the question as to what point talk of the subject has. He adduces an argument too, which basically endorses the idea that an experience has 'what-it-is-likeness', and that requires likeness for a subject. Why should we accept that second premise? It also faces the same question. If experiences have what-it-is-likeness, what is added by insisting that that requires a subject that the likeness is for? Not all likeness is likeness for. The suspicion is that if subjects are experiences then nothing real or genuinely explanatory about experiences is being noted in insisting that they need subjects, beyond, as one might say, speaking with the 'vulgar'.

Finally, if we are prepared to go along with Strawson and say that there are such minimal subjects which are identical with experiences, why should I be tempted to think that I am such a thing – noting of course that I am for all that entitled to think also that I am a human being? What might carry people to that is the universal and strong conviction that they will cease to exist once the current experience ends. But I for one have never met a sane person who seriously thought that. To which one might add – thinking in this sort of way would be singularly useless for us. Our lives require complex forward planning, coupled to retrospective understanding, (think here of building a cathedral, or fighting the Second World War, or writing a book), to which the idea that we endure over time, and through sleep and periods of unconsciousness, and certainly beyond the length of this experience (whatever that is), is quite indispensable.

These queries and remarks do not, of course, settle anything. They do, though, attest to how stimulating and enjoyable it is to engage with the original and invariably elegant essays in Strawson's book.