The Subject of Freedom: Kant, Levinas

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Gabriela Basterra, The Subject of Freedom: Kant, Levinas, Fordham University Press, 2015, 197pp., $29.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823265152.

Reviewed by Kevin Houser, Case Western Reserve University


"What is a subject?" "In what sense is it free?"

If we ask Kant and Levinas these questions we expect incompatible answers -- an expectation encouraged by Levinas, who often deploys Kant as a foil for his own views about reason, morality, and freedom. The flash points are by now familiar. Kant supposes morality arises from practical reason's structure. Levinas, by contrast, insists it is the face of the other that structures rationality and "opens the will to reason." Kant thinks the moral relationship arises from being subject to a common law. Levinas holds that the law is an artifact of a normatively prior ethical relation based on alterity -- precisely what we can never have in common. Kant supposes the morally legitimate law must be self-imposed. Levinas holds that moral subjectivity is "persecution" -- a primordial being-imposed upon. And so on. Both do hold to a close relation between subjectivity, morality and freedom. But there seems at the core of these differences an intractable disagreement about the subject -- specifically, about whether it is autonomy or heteronomy that makes the subject moral and sets the subject free.

Opposing this expectation of contrast is Gabriela Basterra's insightful and difficult book. In it, she insists we replace the narrative of Kant-Levinas conflict or inversion with one of extension and mutual clarification. Levinas critiques but clarifies Kant, "follow[ing] . . . Kant's thinking . . . to its most promising consequences." (4) Kant's notion of the unconditioned, as it appears in the first and third antinomies, "help[s] us appreciate the implications of . . . 'substitution,'" Levinas' term for the pre-reflective ethical sociality through which subjectivity must be understood. (17) Basterra's task, in sum, is to show how Kant's notion of autonomy is better read through Levinas' notion of substitution and how these concepts together provide a fuller picture of a subject that is ethical, rational, and free.

The book has five chapters. The purpose of the first four is to provide an account of the Kantian subject and its unconditioned freedom. Basterra takes up this task because "post-Kantian traditions of autonomy" which feature "a subject that is autonomous by virtue of its self-legislating reason" are "inaccurate, or at least incomplete." (177, note 108) So the Kantian free subject to which she will connect Levinasian substitution must first undergo interpretive revision, after which, in the fifth chapter, she will seek to graft substitution onto the Kantian picture developed in the first four.

Basterra's first two chapters analyze the first (the idea of the world) and third (the idea of freedom) of Kant's antinomies. She believes the structure of these antinomies is the key to understanding the structure of subjectivity. As these antinomies are a problem for theoretical reason, her first task is to situate freedom within the critical structure Kant sets up for knowledge in the first Critique. Freedom can be better understood by a closer understanding of the conditions of knowledge which freedom escapes.

Basterra's analysis of the antinomies hones in on how a horizon of "negative space" is the possibility condition for the cognitive closure of positive thought. To begin to think of an object is to think of where it ends. To think of an object is to think of what -- or, better, where -- that object isn't. Positive thought of an object includes a reference to a periphery, an excess, a negative space beyond it. In this sense, to think an object is to think beyond it, without conflating the object of thought with its condition -- without treating, as another object, this negative beyond.

This, notes Basterra, permits Kant's -- not resolution, but dissolution of the first antinomy. The attempt to cognize the world -- i.e. to cognize, not a thing, but everything at once -- fails. It fails because "everything" has no outside. Without an outside there is no object of cognition. The idea of the world is therefore ruled out as a think-able object and exposed as an aspiration of completeness intrinsic to intellect.

Yet this move beyond the objects of experience known through intuition creates a negative space that isn't merely negative. Basterra cites Monique David-Ménard's claim that this understanding of Kant provides us with more than a sensible object on the one hand and an aspiration of reason on the other. For the bare picture of the sensible object and its indispensable outside or other raises the question of the relation between the sensible and its condition -- a question she next raises about the subject.

In chapter 2, Basterra shifts attention to the third antinomy (is the subject free or not?). The shift from the first antinomy to the "dynamic" third is a shift to a concern about causality -- specifically, the conditions for causal judgments about sensible experience. But little just learned from the first antinomy's adventures in intuit-able objects needs be unlearned in the case of causation. For a sensible causal series, too, requires the same kind of bounding. A causal series is bound by something which, while binding the series as a series, is not itself a member of it, and always just beyond it. Basterra is aware that this antinomy is often thought resolved by what she dubs the traditional view of double reference theory (think Henry Allison's double-aspect view). Double reference supposes Kant dissolves the antinomy of freedom by noting that thesis and antithesis are not a clash of claims but rather two utterly separate perspectives (the empirical and the intelligible) which, taking up a question from two incommensurable spheres, cannot contradict.

Basterra grants this view is Kant's, and rejects it. (56) The double reference view as she sees it utterly splits thesis from anti-thesis, disallowing a relation between them, in turn disallowing a synthesis she thinks Kant's own analysis makes possible. For in the midst of his defense of double reference theory Kant grants "The causality according to the laws of nature is not the only causality . . . it is necessary to assume also a causality through freedom." (49) Like the object, the causal series has itself, along with its excess or other, raising anew the question of their relation.

Basterra claims the free subject is this relation. The subject is the operating construct whose interventions in the causal series unite the empirical and intelligible, the phenomenal and the noumenal. Reason, despising an endless regression, and so aspiring to a cause for which no further condition can account, supposes a subject which, "play[ing] the role of the unconditioned . . . [begins in] itself." (88-89) In thinking about the conditioned, reason thinks the subject as unconditioned. As the relational bounding condition for any causal series -- phenomenal or noumenal -- the subject is not itself caused. Moreover, since the causally unconditioned subject relates the empirical and intelligible, it is neither in harness to the mechanisms of the sensible, nor adrift in the transcendental and body-less abyss of the merely intelligible. In its conditioning of the relation between sensibility and what is beyond it, the subject is neither at home in the sensible nor in what is utterly sundered from it. "Freedom and nature coexist in what we call the subject. The term subjectivity names the interaction between the two." (56) The subject makes freedom imminent. This, Basterra concludes, shows Kant has the resources in the first Critique to show that freedom is not merely possible but indispensable.

What, now, of the practical? How do we get from talk of subjects and causation to subjects and culpability? And how is a subject unmovable by causality moved by morality?

Basterra here shifts her analysis to the second Critique, where Kant shows how freedom motivates. Reason's "being practical" she says, is "The law's power to drive a subject's itinerary." (69). Given her account above, where does the law and its power come from? Basterra's negative answer is: not the subject. "The categorical imperative is not inherent in the subject's nature." Basterra's positive answer is elusive. But she seems entitled to hold that the categorical imperative arises from the subject, understood as a relation required by reason. This means the law doesn't arise from a subject, understood as a reasoner consciously confronting requirements.

Having dealt with its origin and authority, Basterra takes up the law as experienced. The subject's role of the unconditioned in reason, she claims, manifests to the subject (qua conscious reasoner) as an affective and exception-less reason to expel all sensible causes from its motivations. (72) Yet with its normative roots in what is a condition of the understanding (and therefore in what exceeds it), the subject finds itself "animated by a causality [it] does not understand." In experience, the law "addresses and confronts the subject as other." The law is in us but not of us. (80)

Basterra at last moves from her rereading of Kantian subjectivity to her one-chapter discussion of Levinas, having compiled a number of apparent parallels between the two. Kant supposes that the subject is ethically constituted. So does Levinas. Kant thinks there is an other-within-the-same. So does Levinas. Kant thinks there is an imperative which addresses us and whose authority we discover only in our pre-reflective obedience to it. So does Levinas. Granting the law's other-ness, there is a sense in which Kant says we are "heteronomous before we are autonomous." Levinas says this very thing.

Given these commonalities the question turns to difference. What has Levinasian subjectivity to offer which might improve the free subject of Kant? What does Levinas bring to Kant so as to clarify him? Basterra's answer has two parts. The first is an interpretation of Levinas' notion of autonomy. The second is an interpretation of his notion of substitution.

She argues that Levinas' theory of autonomy is remarkably simple. As in Kant, the subject begins always already addressed by an other-ness. The other is an order, which seems to "order me in my own voice." (111) Then, although "I respond without knowing to what," I come to believe I am the source of the order. Thus "Autonomy [for Levinas] consists in believing yourself the author of an order one has received." Autonomy is a belated work of reason -- a (false) story told by the reasoner about the origin of the command that liberates him.

Basterra then brings this interpretation of Levinasian autonomy to bear on substitution. She first offers a reading of Otherwise Than Being as performing, via a substitution of signifiers, the disruption of the ethical other. She shows (convincingly) how Levinas' text seeks to express the beyond of discourse in discourse, thereby re-presenting the disruptive structure of substitution while acknowledging it as beyond representation.

Having sketched its structure, Basterra takes up the substance of substitution by attempting to answer: In substitution, what is substituted? Her account of the one-for-the-other of substitution is: I begin with "the other in me" as command -- a command that arrives before reason. This command arises from "a past that was never present," preventing reflective reason from divining its true source. In attempting to represent or account for this un-seeable source, I come to "believe" myself the author of this otherwise authorless command. And in substituting the true author for myself -- in believing in my autonomy -- I have executed the-one-for-the-other -- have substituted myself for you. In Basterra's terms, "the subject takes the place of the unconditioned . . . [when it] substitutes itself for the other." (134)

Thus what was least convincing in Kant -- the notion that I am the source of my escape from sensible causation via a choice "not in time" -- i.e. that, in an irrecoverable past, I freely chose to be free -- is replaced with a Levinasian substitution, in which the other is the source of the command of morality, that I then mistakenly trace to my own causality. "The subject acts in the name of the other" while "believing it acts in its own." (124) This is Levinas' reversion of heteronomy into autonomy. Just as the law of Kantian autonomy -- the very essence of an inner sovereignty -- can seem to the subject an imperative arising from outside the subject, the same process works in reverse. The initial subjection to the other -- the original heteronomy -- is (mis)represented as autonomy. The free subject, Basterra concludes, is hetero-autonomy. Substitution is this perpetual cycling between original sociality and reason's claims of singularity, and the subject this generative tension, always at the boundary.

Basterra's book is bold -- something to be appreciated when the prime directive of so many authors is not to make a mistake. But I think there are mistakes here. I'll gesture at the problems, exploring none in the depth they deserve.

The primary problem -- the one underwriting many others -- is methodological. Her device for comparison is abstraction. The problem with this device in the context of comparison is that everything is comparable when one abstracts enough. (A man is just like a bug, in that they are both creatures.) What counts as excessive abstraction varies. But many of Basterra's comparisons are so abstract they cover up ethically critical differences. For instance, for Levinas, there are multiple notions of excess -- but the ethical excess of the subject is not merely that the subject's being commanded exceeds reason. Rather, it is an excess responsibility -- that I always have "one responsibility more" than you do -- which constitutes the singled-out-ness of subjectivity. In glossing this over with the general term excess and interpreting it negatively as something that escapes reason, she misses precisely what is ethical in this escape. She also misses what is missing in Kant's skipping the second personal asymmetry of the face-to-face in favor of associating an ethical demand's legitimacy with third personal reciprocity.

Likewise with the term of comparison "address." The law may address us in some sense. But the address of the law is in no way for Levinas, as it is for Kant, original. Basterra attempts a parallel with how the law addresses the subject in Kant and how the face does so in Levinas. (125) But the law is already ethically problematic for Levinas precisely because it does not address the other as Other. Indeed, the legitimacy of the law -- its power to address any one subject -- is constituted by the fact that it addresses more than one. This is the Kantian point that the form of law (which the Other de-forms) is "One ought" and not "You! You alone must . . . " The law doesn't face me -- doesn't face me. As Levinas says, the law effaces -- "is no respecter of persons." Yet this very overlooking -- the ethical importance of the law's blindness, impartiality, anonymity -- is the key to the authority of law. The authority of the face is nothing like this -- it is, against this anonymity, a perpetual protest. Kantian respect, with its humanity of interchangeable men, is both a product of the face-to-face and what is critiqued by it. What Kant presents as the first and fundamental ethical relation Levinas calls a primal disrespect.

Third, it is difficult to discern, in the analysis of the rhetorical devices deployed in Otherwise than Being, anything of ethical relevance. The use of catachresis to mimic the discourse-disruptiveness of ethics in no way shows the ethical nature of the disruption. Many things disrupt discourse as Basterra means it here -- a shout, a gunshot, wonder. So there is nothing substantively ethical in the syntax of a discourse structurally disrupted by a substitution of signifiers. This non-ethical result within spoken discourse is unsurprising since the move to performatives is not to leave "the said" at all, as Basterra seems to think. "Language is already an ethics" means not that the said itself must mimic or demonstrate disruption. It means that language is oriented to an other beyond itself. The one to whom I speak is other than, outside of, and orients speech, in the same the way magnetic North is other than, outside of, and orients the map. I can draw 'N' in the corner of the map. But that representation as it appears on the map orients nothing. Likewise, the other orients language from a place outside it. This is the disruption and orientation of discourse by something discourse does not and cannot contain.

Finally, only excessive abstraction can explain Basterra's mis-reading of substitution. She argues that the substitution is not a flinging of oneself outward, a giving of oneself at the cost of oneself, a suffering for the suffering of another, dying for the other, taking up the responsibilities of the Other. It is, she says, instead a move whereby my consciousness takes credit for something it didn't do. In signing my name over the work of the Other, I credit myself as being the author of my own freedom, and claim the command of the other is one I issued myself.

This is as far from the embodied ethical concreteness of Levinas as one can get. The "Here am I!" and "greater love hath no man," and "the giving of the bread out of one's own mouth," is an ethical self-emptying, not an inner self-crediting. What is substituted in the one-for-the-other is not the impact of the other for a really bad idea about the source of that impact. Substitution is puzzling, certainly. But we won't clarify it by reading substitution as a kind of late-arriving metaphysical plagiarism, wherein I displace the authorship and author-ization of my freedom by the Other with an ingratiating story I tell me about myself.

I've been critical -- but want to add again that Basterra's boldness is refreshing, and a proper metric of her success here should be indexed to the difficulty of the texts and tasks chosen. The way she connects disparate features through structural symmetries does wonderful orienting work, staving off the intellectual vertigo this level of abstraction would otherwise induce. And there are, amidst what I think are sizable mistakes regarding Levinas, numerous originalities and insights that I haven't covered and which those who have read this far won't want to miss.


Levinas, Emmanuel. Totality and Infinity: an Essay on Exteriority. Alphonso Lingis, transl., Duquesne University Press, 1969.

Levinas, Emmanuel. Otherwise than Being or Beyond Essence. Alphonso Lingis, tr., Duquesne University Press, 1974.