The Subject of Liberty: Toward a Feminist Theory of Freedom

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Hirschmann, Nancy J., The Subject of Liberty: Toward a Feminist Theory of Freedom, Princeton University Press, 2003, 308pp, $17.95 (pbk), ISBN 0691096252.

Reviewed by Ann E. Cudd, University of Kansas


This book presents and defends a social constructionist account of freedom and applies the account to three examples of women’s unfreedom to develop and illustrate the use of the theory. Hirschmann’s main aim is to define freedom in a way that is useful to feminism, that is, to understanding the oppression of women. This effort goes against the grain of much recent feminist literature that rejects freedom in favor of autonomy as the basic aim of feminism.

Hirschmann begins with Isaiah Berlin’s distinction between negative and positive liberty and argues that while both concepts are limited, they each provide some insight into freedom that must not be overlooked. Negative liberty focuses on external barriers to successful choice. While Hirschmann thinks choice (or the lack thereof) and the notion of external barriers are crucial to understanding women’s oppression, the focus is too individualistic. Positive liberty extends the analysis of freedom by focusing on the social context of choice-making. Although Berlin rejected positive liberty because of its potentially coercive molding of the citizen for the purposes of the state, Hirschmann takes from positive liberty the notion of the subject as always already socially constructed. By social construction she means not only what social supports are provided for individuals’ choices but also the social construction of the context of choice and of the choice-making subject herself. As she summarizes her agreement with them:

Like classic negative-liberty theorists, I maintain that the ability to make choices and act on them is the basic condition for freedom. However, like positive-liberty theorists, I maintain that choice needs to be understood in terms of the desiring subject, her preferences, her will, and identity. (30)

The book contains a historical chapter in which Hirschmann examines Locke’s, Rousseau’s, Kant’s, and Mill’s theories of freedom or liberty. She argues that each one contains elements of both negative- and positive- liberty theory, despite the fact that each is usually identified entirely with one or the other. While the first three are undeniably sexist, she also argues that each of their theories of freedom are masculinist in their adherence to individualistic accounts of freedom that ignore the deeper levels of social constructionism. While I was initially skeptical of this claim, the examples she examines later in the book help the reader to see the point. If theories of freedom begin with the idea that men are free and equal when and because they can choose their plan of life, then this notion of freedom is blind to the social barriers to women’s freedom, and thus they are masculinist.

The central chapter of the book contains Hirschmann’s discussion of social constructionism and the resulting paradox of social constructionism. The central idea of social construction is that there is no such thing as “human nature”; humans are the products of sociohistorical configuration. On her analysis, three different levels of social analysis are termed “social construction.” The first level is the claim that social construction is ideology, or in other words the misrepresentation of reality. Hirschmann thinks this level of analysis does not go deep enough because it presumes (falsely in her view) that there is some reality that can be apprehended independent of social constructions. The second level claims that social construction is the creation of reality. Hirschmann rejects this as the complete analysis because it ignores the fact that the social constructions themselves have to be interpreted. The third level is social construction as “the discursive construction of social meaning”(81). This is the postmodern interpretation, and Hirschmann accepts the point that reality has to be interpreted through discourse, but wisely resists holding that reality is therefore just discourse. In her view all three levels of social construction are always at play and feed into each other. All three levels also can be seen to give rise to the social construction paradox, which is analogous to the paradox of ideology, which is the problem that the very theory of ideology must itself be seen as ideology. As Hirschmann puts it in applying the paradox to her own theory:

How can women reject patriarchal discourse if we have participated in its construction and it makes us who we are? … How can we ever figure out who “we” are or what “we want” if the language and concepts we must use are antagonistic to the enterprise we seek to carry out, that is, are themselves barriers to women’s freedom? (99)

The answer is that patriarchy is not total, nor is it the only structure of constraint on women. In order to train women for their social roles, for example, women learn to read and have the opportunity to read and create feminist theory. Further, there are activities that are not primarily constructed along the lines of gender, for example, those that are along race and class lines, and these provide fissures through which the patriarchy can be exposed and resisted.

Three chapters of the book take up three sites of women’s oppression: domestic violence, welfare (in the U.S. context), and veiling practices in Muslim countries. With these chapters Hirschmann aims to illustrate the ways that a full appreciation of the social construction of each site can best illuminate the complexities of women’s oppression. She also shows how the particular social practice and institutions of women’s roles, romantic love, sexuality, law enforcement, child custody, etc. construct the available choices for women. Women are clearly agents choosing within these constraints, but their freedom is limited relative to that of men. I found the veiling chapter somewhat problematic, however. Hirschmann writes:

I will argue that veiling itself is not oppressive, but rather that its deployment as a cultural symbol and practice may provide (and often has done so) a form and mode by which patriarchy oppresses women in specific contexts. (171)

She then argues that there are contexts in which women choose segregation and veiling in order to celebrate their femininity. But this example seems to recognize that veiling necessarily entails segregation of women and men. Unlike Hirschmann, I would argue that such segregation is necessarily oppressive, because it denies individuals the opportunity to choose not to be identified by this arbitrary feature of themselves, i.e., their gender. This example seems to me to be a prime instance of the lack of inner freedom that her social construction theory reveals.

Hirschmann aligns herself with feminists such as Drucilla Cornell and Amartya Sen (though disagreeing with details of their theories), who champion freedom rather than autonomy as the goal of feminism. Autonomy theorists look not to choice but rational or moral behavior as the hallmark of personhood. To be autonomous one needs to have a rationally formulated sense of the good and a plan of life that can be reasonably expected to achieve it. Hirschmann argues that freedom is prior to autonomy because the ability to be an agent, that is, to make a choice does not require that an individual have a clear sense of the good and a rational plan to achieve it. She is not clear, however, on why feminists should not want autonomy on top of freedom. In the end, I would agree with her view, but I think we would part company on why this is so. For Hirschmann, feminism is ultimately a kind of solidarity with women. Consider the following statement in the ultimate chapter of the book:

I do think that feminist freedom requires that women’s decision be respected, regardless of what they choose; feminists must support, in principle, if not politically, women’s choices to oppose abortion, stay with abusers, not report rape or sexual harassment, or become full-time mothers and housewives … . But such respect is motivated at least as much by recognition of oppression – as in the case of the battered woman who returns to her abuser because she has nowhere else to go or fears for the safety of her family – as respect for freedom – as in the case of pro-life women who believe that abortion is murder. (237-8)

This seems to me to be an explosive bullet for a feminist to bite. Such choices are for unfreedom, and as such ought to be regarded by feminists in the same way Mill regarded contracting oneself into slavery. Such choices are contradictory to the very idea of freedom. Furthermore, when women make these choices they strengthen the very institutions that oppress women. So I think that feminists need to be able not to respect such choices. Autonomy theorists are able to do this by showing that the choices are irrational or came about through a process of desire formation that is itself compromised by oppression. But I also think that Hirschmann’s theory provides the tools to criticize these choices. For, as she has shown for at least some of the examples, they are socially constructed within social systems that systematically favor men. That Hirschmann fails to see this application of her theory is surprising, I think, but it further strengthens the claim that she has produced a very useful theory of freedom for the cause of feminism.