The Subject's Point of View

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Katalin Farkas, The Subject's Point of View, Oxford University Press, 2008, 197pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199230327.

Reviewed by Sandy Goldberg, Northwestern University


Katalin Farkas' The Subject's Point of View is a wonderful book. In it Farkas makes the case for what she calls a "Cartesian" theory of mind, according to which the defining features of mental states have to do with the special sort of access each subject has to her own states of mind. After presenting her case for this thesis, the remaining burden of the book is to establish that this characterization of mental states favors 'internalist' over 'externalist' approaches to the mind. (Farkas thus embraces the 'internalist' aspects of Cartesianism, but she does not endorse the dualistic aspects.)

This book has a great many virtues. It contains a detailed presentation of the motivation for internalism in the philosophy of mind. While some of the points she develops in this connection have things in common with recent work by e.g. Terry Horgan, Charles Siewart, and Brian Loar, Farkas makes clear precisely where her views differ from theirs, and where they do, she presents novel points in favor of her proposals. What is more, in addressing herself to the much-discussed topic of the compatibility of externalism and privileged self-knowledge, she has an extended discussion of the discriminability condition on knowledge. The various distinctions she draws between varieties of discriminability bring new illumination to this topic; even those who have thought long and hard about this topic will find this aspect of her discussion worthwhile. Finally, the last chapter of the book has a very nice discussion of the feasibility of internalism about content in the face of worries about whether internalist content is up to the task of determining truth conditions. There Farkas offers a robust defense of a rather radical version of internalism -- one that (unlike most other versions) does not concede that there is ever any need for an externalist (or 'broad') notion of content. In short, this book is a wonderful addition to the literature on intentionality, and in particular on the internalism/externalism debate.

The structure of her book reflects its ambitions. In the first part she develops her case for the "Cartesian" picture of the mind. Eschewing Descartes' dualistic aspirations, Farkas aims instead to establish that our standard conception of mental states is committed to the idea that what is distinctive of the mental is the 'special access' the subject herself has to the states in question. Farkas then goes on to connect this feature of mentality to the nature of mental facts as 'perspectival' facts, that is, facts regarding how things are for the subject in question. The proposed connection is this: the mental realm just is the subject matter of that capacity that "endows" the subject with this "special access" (22). Unless a state of a subject can be known in this special way, the state itself is not a mental state.

What is the special way in question? Farkas develops her proposal using the evil demon scenario. The victim of Descartes' evil demon fails to know a good deal of what she might take herself to know (e.g. through perception, testimony, and memory). But there are some things she is still in a position to know. On Farkas' presentation, such a subject is still in a position to know how things seem to her. In this way the subject might know e.g. that she is currently experiencing a red sensation, is feeling a slight pain in her thigh, thinks that it would be nice to enjoy an ice cream sundae, and so forth. Farkas' contentions are two-fold: first, that the sort of knowledge that is preserved even under conditions of victimization by a maximally powerful evil demon is knowledge of one's mental states, and second, that the way one acquires such knowledge constitutes the 'special way' each of us knows his or her own mind. Farkas goes on to develop the claim that the way in question is through introspection, conceived as a faculty through which we detect certain features of ours (such as pains, desires, and beliefs).

The picture Farkas is hawking here is, of course, a very traditional one. She makes a good case for thinking that this traditional picture is central to our notion of personhood (Chapter 3), and that it makes good sense of our pre-theoretical understanding of the distinction between the mental and the physical: it predicts which states of ours we will pretheoretically count as mental, and which as (merely) physical (Chapter 2). That this traditional picture should have the latter result is not as obvious as one might suppose. Consider for example the state of having one's legs crossed. This is presumably a bodily state; yet it would appear to be known through proprioception (or bodily self-awareness) -- a faculty not unlike introspection. That we might know of certain of our bodily states in this way might then be thought to challenge Farkas' claim that mental states just are those states known in this special (introspective) way. Farkas devotes a good deal of attention in Chapter 2 to showing that proprioceptive knowledge does not challenge her 'special access' characterization of mental states.

Of course, one might well question whether a philosophical theory of the mental domain ought to aim to capture our pretheoretical understanding in the first place. It is easy to imagine a good many contemporary philosophers of mind who would press this sort of objection. Such objections are not raised or responded to anywhere in the book. At the same time, however, it would be churlish to make too much of this. Farkas is quite explicit that her aim is to resuscitate that part of the 'Cartesian' picture of mind that derives from the doctrine of the mental as that domain to which thinkers have a 'special access'. Those who complain that the argument for such a view depends crucially on taking pretheoretical 'common sense' for granted, or that it relies uncritically on our notion of personhood, would do better to read this book as making the case for a conditional conclusion. Farkas is after what follows if we assume this part of our commonsense conception of the mind.

And it is clear that Farkas thinks important things do follow from this traditional picture. In Part II of the book, she argues that 'externalist' views about the mind should be rejected in favor of her proposed 'internalist' view, on the grounds that only the latter coheres with the special access doctrine developed in Part I. For those who have been following the relevant literature, this issue -- commonly referred to as 'the compatibility of externalism and self-knowledge' -- is a much-discussed topic in the literature. Even though I have my doubts about whether Farkas succeeds in securing an incompatibilist conclusion, nevertheless I think her discussion in Part II will be of great interest even to those who have followed this literature very closely.

For one thing, Part II begins with what to my mind is the clearest attempt to date to nail down the externalist thesis itself. As Farkas makes clear, various traditional construals of this doctrine are unacceptable, for having implications that no externalist should want to countenance. Among these is one according to which a subject's "external" states are those that fail to supervene on her intrinsic, nonrelational states. On this construal externalism is the thesis that two subjects alike in all of their intrinsic, nonrelational physical features can nevertheless differ in the mental properties they exemplify. The trouble with such a construal of externalism, according to Farkas, is that such a view would not be established by what externalists themselves should regard as "a perfectly good argument for externalism," albeit one that is "based on the 'external' facts being inside the body" (77). After developing this and related points, Farkas concludes with her favored construal of the internal/external distinction: insofar as we want to regard the internal/external distinction as whatever is/is not shared by doppelgängers, the relevant relation between the doppelgängers is subjective indistinguishability -- the sort of relation that holds when and only when "things appear (look, taste, smell, sound) the same for them; or the world is (and has always been) the same from their subjective viewpoint," p. 82; italics in original). A state α is external in this sense when, given a subject S who is in α, there can be a doppelgänger who is like S with respect to how things appear to her/him, but where the doppelgänger is not in α.

As Farkas is well aware, this does not settle matters, since there is a way to understand this talk of "same appearances" on which externalists will reject the claim that doppelgängers are in "subjectively indistinguishable" situations (in this "same appearances" sense). Take Oscar and Twin-Oscar. Externalists want to say that these subjects have different 'water'-concepts (each expressing a different concept with their respective uses of 'water'). So insofar as "how things appear" to Oscar and Twin-Oscar involves things appearing in ways that each of the twins expresses with a use of 'water' -- for example, each might be such that how things seem to him then and there is best expressed by each with the sentence-form 'the water over yonder is cold' -- then how things seem differ between them. It seems to Oscar that the water over yonder is cold, whereas it seems to Twin-Oscar that the twater over yonder is cold. And if this is right, then how things seem on this construal can't be what the twins have in common, and so can't capture what is relevantly 'internal' (or shared by the twins). Farkas is well aware that some externalists are likely to respond in this fashion. Her own view is that subjective indistinguishability is best construed in terms of indistinguishability of phenomenal properties. After defending such a view against several worries (including the worry that the 'same appearance relation' is not transitive, p. 94), Farkas goes on to point out that any externalist who thinks to deny this will leave it utterly mysterious how twin situations are alike. In this way Farkas aims to put the burden on the externalist: make clear what is in common between twins cases, in such a way that what are regarded as the traditional arguments for externalism are vindicated. Farkas is dubious that this challenge can be met.

She devotes a good deal of time to addressing whether, in response to this challenge, the externalist might make use of one or another epistemic construal of 'subjective indistinguishability'. The arguments she offers on this score (Chapter 5) strike me as quite insightful, and should be of great interest to epistemologists independent of their level of interest in the internalism/externalism debate in the philosophy of mind. Here Farkas distinguishes three epistemic conceptions of indistinguishability: scenarios X and Y are 'actively' indistinguishable to a subject S if S cannot activate knowledge that X and Y are distinct; X and Y are 'access' indistinguishable to S if everything she knows in X is true in Y (S's knowledge does not enable her to 'rule out' Y); and X and Y are 'response' indiscriminable to S if and only if these scenarios generate the same cognitive response in her. Farkas argues that none of these can be successfully employed by the externalist to characterize what is in common in the twins' case. This part of Farkas' discussion is very insightful, and identifies a challenge that externalists will want to address.

But Farkas is not satisfied to have put the externalist on the defensive on this topic. Rather, she aims to strike a more serious blow by establishing that externalism is incompatible with the privileged access doctrine developed in Part I. It is here, of course, that she is traversing some well-worn territory. It is also here that I find her core argument less than fully persuasive.

Farkas' case for the incompatibility of externalism and privileged self-knowledge is anticipated in her positive account of this sort of knowledge. Early in Chapter 6 (the chapter she devotes to this issue) she argues that a subject has privileged access to all and only those facts that constitute her perspective on things. In accord with Farkas' prior discussion of subjective indistinguishability, she argues that these facts are determined by the relevant phenomenal facts, since it is these facts that determine "how things seem" to the subject. On this picture, externalistically-individuated states, which by the externalist's own light depend for their individuation on factors that do not supervene on the subject's phenomenal states, are not knowable in a privileged way by the subject.

Farkas spends most of Chapter 6 arguing that what her picture predicts will be the case -- that if externalism is true then subjects do not have privileged knowledge of their own mental states -- is indeed what we find to be the case. She begins her argument by pointing out that Burge's initial (1988) attempt to secure the compatibility of externalism and privileged self-knowledge, which appealed to the self-verifying nature of judgments like '(With this very thought) I think: water is wet', cannot be extended to cover cases of mental features other than currently-entertained thought-contents. She then goes on to wonder whether the discriminability condition on knowledge might put us in the position of drawing even a stronger conclusion, to the effect that Burge's 1988 account fails to hold even in the restricted class of (cogito) cases it is designed to capture. In pursuing this question Farkas is following the lead of earlier arguments on this score (esp. Boghossian 1989). These arguments had sought to show that, given the possibility of cases in which a subject is the unwitting victim of a world-switching regimen, and the fact that the resulting 'twin' thoughts would be subjectively indistinguishable to her, such a victim would fail to be in a position to know her occurrent thoughts in a privileged way. This sort of argument is familiar (it is anticipated in Burge 1988 and developed in Boghossian 1989). But Farkas' presentation has the virtue of being informed by her insightful discussion of the various epistemic notions of discriminability. In this respect Farkas' discussion here can be seen as moving beyond the other discussions of discriminability in connection with externalism and self-knowledge (Falvey and Owens 1994, McLaughlin and Tye 1998, and Brown 2004.) Interestingly, Farkas' conclusion is one that is concessive to the compatibilist: she concludes that, however it is construed, the discriminability condition on knowledge fails to yield a decisive case for the incompatibility of externalism and privileged self-knowledge. (Compare Goldberg 2005, 2006.) However, rather than concluding from this that there will be no sound incompatibilist argument from the discriminability requirement on knowledge, as the other authors just cited have done, Farkas moves immediately to argue that the real issue in the self-knowledge debate concerns the 'transparency' of thought.

Once again, the claim she makes on this score is familiar. Transparency requires that, for any two thoughts that the subject can think, she is able to tell by reflection alone whether these thoughts are the same or different (have the same content or not). (See Brown 2004 for a detailed presentation.) It is widely agreed by friends and foes of externalism alike that externalistically-individuated thoughts fail to meet this condition: ordinary subjects who are agnostic about the application conditions of their 'water'-concept(s) would not be able to tell water-thoughts from twater-thoughts. Boghossian (1992, 1994) appealed to the non-transparent nature of externalist thoughts and concepts to level the charge that, if externalism is true, then an unwittingly world-switched subject who acquired both of the 'twin' concepts could reason in a way that exhibited logical equivocations, yet would not be in a position even through searching reflection to tell that her reasoning was guilty of such an equivocation. Boghossian claimed that this is a sufficient basis for rejecting externalism. A good many others have disagreed with Boghossian, either because they claimed to find ways that the externalist could avoid this unhappy result (Schiffer 1994; Burge 1996; but see also Goldberg 2007), or because they defended this result as ultimately acceptable on independent grounds (Owens 1986; Burge 1978, 1996, 1998; and Brown 2004). It is curious, then, that while Farkas levels the same sort of charge Boghossian had leveled -- externalism gives rise to reflectively undetectable equivocations in reasoning, and should be rejected for this reason -- she does not consider the broad variety of responses that have been made to this charge. The result is that committed externalists might well leave this chapter with the impression that Farkas has not advanced the case for the incompatibility of externalism and privileged self-knowledge. Her work in identifying the various notions of discriminability has made clear the dim prospects for an incompatibilist result by appeal to a discriminability condition on knowledge. Moreover, her own positive argument for incompatibilism, from externalism's implications for the transparency of thought, does not engage with the recent literature on this topic. Since establishing incompatibilism was one of the main aims of the chapter, and indeed of Part II of the book, these would appear to be important shortcomings.

I should add that the book ends with a wide-ranging examination of a common objection to internalist accounts of mentality. According to this objection, internalist features of thought do not determine the thought's truth-conditions, and so should not be regarded as representational features of the thought. Even some proponents of internalism have endorsed this objection, holding that it motivates the need for an externalist (or 'broad') notion of thought-content in addition to an internalist (or 'narrow') one. Farkas' discussion of this objection (in Chapter 7) is wide-ranging, covering such things as the nature of the sense-reference distinction, the motives for regarding thought-contents as having their truth-conditions essentially, McFarlane's contextualist semantics, and two-dimensionalism. In responding to the objection, Farkas defends the strong view that there is no need to postulate any sort of thought-content beyond the internalist (narrow) sort. In so doing she aims to resuscitate what she calls the 'Aristotelian' view that one and the same thought-content can differ in truth value at different times. (She also draws out the similarities between her proposal and MacFarlane's proposal for a 'non-indexical contextualism'.) There is much here that will prompt a rethinking of standard criticisms of the 'narrow' content proposal.

My verdict regarding Part II of the book, then, is this. On the one hand, Farkas' discussions in this part of the book have indeed advanced several important debates: she has developed an interesting new challenge facing externalists, that of characterizing what is in common between doppelgängers in such a way as to underwrite standard arguments for externalism. She has clarified various epistemic notions of discriminability, and so has helped our understanding of would-be incompatibilist arguments that appeal to a discriminability requirement on knowledge; and in the face of some very strong objections she has developed the case for thinking that internalist features of thought can be considered representational features of thought, despite not determining thoughts' truth-conditions. On the other hand, doubts remain regarding whether she is successful in her central ambition, to present a compelling case for the incompatibility of externalism and the doctrine of privileged self-knowledge. I am left with the curious impression that, while Farkas may not have succeeded in doing what she set out to do -- show how externalist accounts of mental states fail, for being incompatible with the core epistemic feature of mentality itself, developed in Part I of the book -- nevertheless her successes on other matters are so impressive as to overwhelm this weakness. In fact, I would go so far as to say that these successes ought to put externalists on notice that even a radically internalist account of mentality, such as the one Farkas develops in this book, may be better off than many of us have supposed.


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