The Sublime: From Antiquity to the Present

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Timothy M. Costelloe (ed.), The Sublime: From Antiquity to the Present, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 304pp., $35.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780521143677.

Reviewed by Jeanette Bicknell, Toronto, Canada


The sublime is a large (not to say unwieldy) topic and sprawls awkwardly across a number of academic disciplines. This book offers a collection of fifteen essays on the sublime plus an introductory overview by the editor. It had its genesis in a 2007 NEH Summer Seminar on the aesthetics of the Scottish Enlightenment organized by Paul Guyer and Rachel Zuckert, both of whom contribute articles to the volume. Costelloe has appropriately solicited contributions from scholars in several different academic fields. While most of them are philosophers, others have their professional homes in Classics, American Studies, Comparative Literature, Germanic and Dutch Studies, and Architecture. The volume has been nicely put together and contains an extensive bibliography and index, and is illustrated by a number of variable quality black and white photographs, drawings, and reproductions of paintings.

Costelloe arranged the volume in two parts, with the first eight essays presenting a philosophical history of the sublime, and the second seven devoted to various "uses" of the sublime. As I read through the collection I found myself structuring the essays differently. Three of the essays are conceptual in nature: Emily Brady's on the environmental sublime, Theodore Gracyk's on the sublime and the fine arts, and Andrew Chignell and Matthew Halteman's on religion and the sublime. Six of the essays are "straight" history of philosophy: Rodolph Gasché's on Burke, Melissa McBay Merritt's on Kant, Guyer's on the German Romantic sublime, David Johnson's on the postmodern sublime, and Zuckert's and Costelloe's on eighteenth century trends in the philosophy of art. The remaining six essays are best classified as interdisciplinary (Chandos Michael Brown's on the American sublime, Adam Potkay's on the British Romantic sublime, and Richard Etlin's on the sublime in architecture) or as intellectual history (because they engage with broader, external concerns in a way not typical of writing on the history of philosophy). These latter include John Eyck's essay on the sublime in Dutch aesthetics (which will be of interest primarily to specialists) and Éva Madeleine Martin's on the sublime in early modern France.

The first paper, Malcolm Heath's "Longinus and the Ancient Sublime," is best classified as intellectual history and it ably prepares the groundwork for the remainder of the volume. It is a close reading of Peri Hupsos (On Sublimity), attributed to the critic Longinus. This third century ACE treatise was rediscovered in the early modern period and exerted considerable influence on the emerging discipline of philosophical aesthetics. Arguably one of the reasons for the treatise's influence is that, while a forceful piece of writing, it leaves lots of leeway for interpretation. Longinus (as Heath demonstrates) never provides a straightforward definition of "sublimity" but instead offers examples and a series of oblique characterizations. Furthermore Longinus was well aware of the philosophical implications of his subject. Heath's article puts On Sublimity squarely in its historical and rhetorical context, and his close reading is not so exhaustive or detailed as to preclude a wide readership. Even those without much exposure to the study of ancient rhetoric should find it accessible and engaging.

After Longinus, the most influential writers on the sublime were Burke and Kant, and an entire essay is devoted to each. Gasché is equally interested in Burke's account of the beautiful as of the sublime. He defends Burke's account of female beauty and makes the bold (yet qualified) claim that, "from today's perspective, beauty is perhaps the intrinsically more important and stimulating part of Burke's aesthetics" (p. 26, emphasis added). Merritt's ambitious paper on the Kantian sublime places the concept within his broader critical framework and traces the connections between the sublime in Kant's aesthetics and his moral philosophy. Her aim is "to show how we can understand the Kantian sublime by tracing it to its roots in the moral psychology of the rational animal" (p. 39).

Costelloe and Zuckert divide up the dominant trends in eighteenth century English-speaking aesthetics. Costelloe discusses the internal sense theories of Shaftesbury and Reid, and the imagination-based theories of Addison and Reynolds. The inclusion of the latter's Discourses on Art, and Costelloe's plea that it be read less narrowly, are both welcome. Zuckert provides a thoughtful discussion of the thinkers who defended associative accounts of the sublime: Gerard, Kames, Alison, and Stewart. The essay by Martin traces the reception of Longinus in early modern France prior to Boileau's celebrated translation and shows how On Sublimity was promoted by those who dissented from the prevailing literary status quo.

Guyer's essay on the German sublime after Kant is one of two (along with Potkay's discussion of the British Romantic sublime) that bridges the gap between the early modern period and the later twentieth century. Guyer provides an overview of his topic, discussing the sublime in Schiller, Schelling, Hegel, and Schopenhauer. One particularly stimulating aspect of Guyer's article is his reading of Nietzsche's Dionysian as his version of the sublime. We come to the present day with Johnson's overview of the four most significant thinkers of the postmodern sublime: Lyotard, Kristeva, Deleuze and Jameson. All four have been influenced by Kant, although they "critique, invert, or undermine" him in various ways (p. 119) and each comes to different conclusions. Johnson's survey of these thinkers is clear and careful and it is no criticism of it to say his valiant attempt to explain what Deleuze meant by the "body without organs" left me little the wiser.

The interdisciplinary essays round out the volume and give hints of how creative artists and writers responded to philosophical discourse. Potkay's essay focuses on poetry and on literary theory. He argues that contemporary critics have misread the British Romantic poets and have failed to see that the theme of transcendence in their work has a robust moral component. He makes a case for the importance of ethics in discussions of literature, lest we lose touch with a "crucial component" of what draws us to reading (p. 216). The essay on architecture and the sublime by Etlin (incidentally the longest and best-illustrated in the volume) takes a similarly interdisciplinary perspective. Etlin considers the sublime in architecture from ancient Rome to the work of the French neo-classical architect Boullée. Throughout this history, he argues, there was a constant interchange between architecture and literature. Brown's very interesting paper on the American sublime considers the matrix of imperial expansion, revolution, the pursuit of knowledge, and the contested meanings of national and natural history from about 1700 until the late 1840's. He demonstrates how religious, aesthetic and scientific concerns together inform that period's writings on American nature and landscape.

The remaining three essays are conceptual rather than primarily historical in orientation. In an extremely ambitious paper, Chignell and Halteman attempt to provide a theoretical template for the relationship between religion and the sublime. Given the breadth and depth of their topic and the constraints of the essay format, it is not unexpected that their paper contains more stipulation than argument.

Brady and Gracyk both, in different ways, reflect on the role of the sublime in the fine arts. Most writers on the sublime, from Longinus onwards, have considered it unproblematic that sublimity could be a predicate of both art and nature. While there is disagreement over whether Kant meant that art as well as nature could arouse feelings of the sublime, he did include non-natural phenomena as examples of the sublime. Brady is "not persuaded" that the sublime, as originally and best understood, applies in important ways to art (p. 173). She aims to make a place for the sublime in environmental aesthetics, and by extension environmental ethics. Brady argues that sublime experiences could be said, "to constitute a type of meaningful relationship between humans and other parts of nature" (p. 182). These are fascinating topics and I look forward to hearing more from her on them.

Gracyk asks whether, in order to convey sublimity, an artwork itself needs to be sublime. Or put another way, is there a general problem about the relation of an artwork's subject matter to its representational embodiment? If the different arts are problematic in this respect for different reasons, then there is no general problem to be considered. The main difficulty is that aesthetic properties of a work can obscure or omit aesthetic features of the work's subject matter. A painting representing a sublime landscape can itself be hackneyed, and a poem celebrating sublime emotions can be insipid. Gracyk argues that the nineteenth century acceptance of instrumental music as sublime without being beautiful opened the door both to the status of music as a fine art and to the abstract sublime in painting. He concludes that despite over three hundred years of debate there remains no consensus about how and when sublimity is present in fine art.

A few remarks on the volume as a whole: First, I would liked to have seen an essay dedicated to the relationship -- whether conceptual or historical -- between beauty and the sublime. Several of the essays touch upon this topic or consider it within some limited context, so an extended treatment would have been welcome. Second, given that Costelloe believes that the sublime "can no more disappear than the experiences to which it refers" (p. 7) it would have been nice to see an essay dedicated to describing and making sense of those experiences. I applaud Costelloe for venturing beyond the confines of philosophy, but I wish he had gone as far as the social sciences. An essay by an empirically-oriented psychologist or anthropologist would have rounded out the volume nicely.