The Sublime in Modern Philosophy: Aesthetics, Ethics, and Nature

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Emily Brady, The Sublime in Modern Philosophy: Aesthetics, Ethics, and Nature, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 227pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521194143.

Reviewed by Sandra Shapshay, Indiana University


In this book Emily Brady seeks to 'reassess' and 'reclaim' the concept of the sublime in order to show the continuing relevance of this aesthetic category for debates in contemporary aesthetics and environmental thought. This aim is important, and it is one with which I have great sympathy.[1] In recent years the concept has been used, on the one hand, too liberally by postmodern philosophers who have stretched 'the sublime' beyond conceptual coherence, and, on the other hand, too little by Anglo-American philosophers who have largely forgotten this aesthetic category. Brady makes a good case that the neglect of the concept by Anglo-American aestheticians is unjustified: sublime responses, especially to natural environments, are still with us today, and may be even more frequent than in former times given that "Places that were once distant and inaccessible have become much closer through adventure tourism and the like." (p. 186).

In addition, Brady supports the claim that contemporary tastes in landscapes have not changed radically since the 18th century by citing the work of several contemporary nature writers such as Páll Skúlason, who writes about the volcanic landscape of Askja in Iceland, and Lucy Lippard, who relates her experience of the Grand Canyon. While sublime responses today might not be as Romantic or theological as in previous centuries, Brady shows that there is, nonetheless, significant continuity to be found, ranging from the experience of vast and powerful landscapes had by European elites on the Grand Tour, to Romantic poets such as Wordsworth and Coleridge and the American naturalists Thoreau and Muir, to nature appreciators today.

The book is divided into two roughly equal parts. In Part I, Brady aims to characterize the core meaning of the sublime by tracing its development from the rhetorical sublime of Longinus into a category largely of nature appreciation in the 18th century with the aesthetic theories of Addison, Gerard, Burke, and Alison (in Britain) and Mendelssohn and Kant (in Germany). In Chapter 4 she continues the narrative with subsequent developments of the category of the sublime affected by Schiller, Schopenhauer and British Romanticism. In Part II, Brady considers the relevance of this core meaning of the sublime she derives from the history of aesthetic theory for contemporary aesthetics and environmental thought, taking up the following questions. Can artworks be sublime in a non-derivative sense? What distinguishes the sublime from neighboring categories such as 'grandeur,' 'terrible beauty,' and 'wonder'? How does sublime response compare with an engagement with tragedy? And what is the relevance of the sublime for valuing the environment both aesthetically and ethically?

The historical discussion of the sublime in the 18th and 19th centuries, especially regarding the British theorists, is well researched and remarkably comprehensive for a volume of this size. Notwithstanding, I take issue with some of the details in her characterization of this historical development. Further, I believe these problems raise difficulties for her reconstruction of a concept of the sublime that is relevant for contemporary environmental aesthetics, as I shall suggest in what follows.

Brady devotes two chapters to Kant's pre-critical and critical treatments of the sublime, as is fitting given the sophistication and influence of Kant's mature theory. She seeks ultimately to reconstruct and rehabilitate a basically Kantian theory of the sublime for contemporary philosophy. In order to do so, Brady responds to a major objection that has been leveled at Kant's theory, namely, that it is overly anthropocentric and even self-aggrandizing in holding that, properly speaking, only the human mind -- not the phenomenal world -- is sublime.

She argues convincingly that the formless qualities of natural objects are causally indispensable to Kant's theory and that, charitably understood, the reason why Kant claims that in calling nature sublime we commit the error of 'subreption' -- that is, we project a feeling of respect for ourselves onto nature -- is that respect is only appropriately felt for rational beings. It is, however, appropriate to feel admiration -- a feeing akin to but not identical to respect -- for natural objects according to Kant (p. 81). Thus, Brady offers an attractive interpretation of Kant's theory of the sublime that saves it from the charge of anthropocentrism.

From her historical investigation, Brady derives the following characterization of the core meaning of the sublime:

Paradigm cases of the natural sublime are characterized principally by perceptual and expressive qualities relating to great height or vastness (the mathematically sublime) or tremendous power (the dynamically sublime). A range of more specific multi-sensory qualities can be identified, such as darkness, obscurity, greatness, massiveness, the tremendous, towering, dizzying, shapeless, formless, boundless, blasting, thundering, roaring, raging, disordered, dynamic, tumultuous, and so on. . . . Sublime qualities cause intense, mixed emotional responses characterized by feelings of being overwhelmed and anxious, combined with excitement and pleasure (p. 187).

This characterization strikes me as a good start, but it leaves under-analyzed the source of the positive feelings of 'excitement and pleasure.' This is somewhat surprising since the source and phenomenal character of the pleasure in the sublime was a bone of contention in the modern period, and in neglecting this issue, Brady elides important differences in how theorists addressed the 'problem of the sublime.'

However, there seems to me to be a major difference between physiological accounts of sublime pleasure (or 'delight'), such as Burke's, and transcendental accounts, such as those given by Kant and Schopenhauer. While Burke's account sees the sublime as a largely non-cognitive, affective arousal, which I call the 'thin sublime', Kant's account (I'll leave Schopenhauer out of it for simplicity's sake) understands the sublime response as including, in addition to this affective arousal, an intellectual play with ideas involving especially ideas regarding the place of human beings within the environment. I call this the 'thick sublime'.

Burke explicitly contrasts his theory of delight -- the relief that a spectator feels when the threatening kind of object is perceived as not immediately, personally threatening -- from more cognitive accounts of the pleasure in sublime response. In a related discussion of the problem of tragedy, Burke writes,

I am afraid it is a practice much too common in inquiries of this nature, to attribute the cause of feelings which merely arise from the mechanical structures of our bodies, or from the natural frame and constitution of our minds, to certain conclusions of the reasoning faculty on the objects presented to us; for I should imagine, that the influence of reason in producing our passions is nothing near so extensive as it is commonly believed. (Philosophical Enquiry, 71)

By contrast, for Kant the feeling of pleasurable elevation in the sublime involves a significant contribution from the reasoning faculty. In Kant, the pleasure in the sublime derives from an awareness of one's own rational nature and moral vocation, brought on paradigmatically by a confrontation with vast or powerful nature and the resulting free play of the imagination and reason.

Brady addresses my distinction between the thin and thick sublime in Chapter 8 in the context of her discussion of the relevance of the sublime for contemporary environmental aesthetics, but she misconstrues the type of cognitivism that I see as at work in the distinction as it arose in the 18th-19th centuries.

On my view, the different accounts of the sublime that emerge in the modern period concern whether or not any significant intellectual play of ideas is present in the phenomenology. Brady construes the thick sublime as involving necessarily the scientific-cognitivism espoused by Allen Carlson's environmental aesthetic theory (p. 189), whereas the thick sublime as I understand itmay draw on scientific knowledge, but it need not in order to count as a thick sublime response. As theorized by Kant, it was not specifically scientific knowledge that was seen as being brought to bear on one's experiences with vast or powerful natural phenomena, but rather transcendental-existential ideas about one's finitude, freedom, and rational power in relationship to the natural world.

Brady rightly characterizes the divergence in our views on the contemporary environmental sublime as deriving from a different interpretation of Kant's theory: as she describes it, I interpret "both Kant's and Schopenhauer's views of the sublime as having cognitive or intellective components" whereas she "[has] interpreted the more reflective aspects in terms of aesthetic feeling or aesthetic apprehension" (p. 189). I believe there is significant textual support for my more intellectual reading. First, Kant describes the judgment of the sublime as issuing from a free-play of the imagination and reason. When one unpacks what this free-play amounts to, it seems to involve entertaining quite a lot of cognitive content rather than simply having aesthetic feelings and apprehensions. Consider for instance, the following representative passage:

The irresistibility of [nature's] power certainly makes us, considered as natural beings, recognize our physical powerlessness, but at the same time it reveals a capacity for judging ourselves as independent of it and a superiority over nature on which is grounded a self-preservation of quite another kind . . . In this way, in our aesthetic judgment nature is judged as sublime not insofar as it arouses fear, but rather because it calls forth our power (which is not part of nature) to regard those things about which we are concerned (goods, health and life) as trivial, and hence to regard its power (to which we are, to be sure, subjected in regard to these things) as not the sort of dominion over ourselves and our authority to which we would have to bow if it came down to our highest principles and their affirmation or abandonment (Critique of the Power of Judgment 145; 5: 261-2).

As Kant describes the phenomenology of dynamically sublime experience here, there is a considerable amount of entertaining of various ideas about the self in relation to nature: We 'recognize' our physical powerlessness, we 'regard' those things about which we are generally concerned as trivial, we 'regard' nature's power as not 'the sort of dominion over ourselves . . . to which we would have to bow if it came down to our highest principles.' It is precisely by virtue of these kinds of thoughts that we derive the elevated pleasure of the dynamically sublime on Kant's theory, in contrast to the more immediate, physiological relief that characterizes Burke's 'delight'.

So it is puzzling to me why Brady would espouse a basically Kantian view of the sublime, which seems on the basis of passages like that quoted above to constitute a thick sublime, but would argue that the account of the sublime I attribute to Kant and Schopenhauer is better called 'wonder' "given the strong intellective component often attributed to the latter category" (p. 189).

Another problem with the core meaning of the sublime Brady reclaims is that she seems conflicted about how much of the Kantian transcendental story she would like to retain. She seeks to retain certain features of the Kantian approach "without invoking the full metaphysical baggage of his transcendental philosophy" (p. 88), for it seems that the invocation of reason and a supersensible side of us in Kant's phenomenology makes his theory "not as easily matched to our actual experiences of the sublime" (p. 56). Yet, in her criticism of Paul Crowther's attempt to offer a non-metaphysical reconstruction of a Kantian artistic sublime, Brady faults his view for skirting "an important part of this relational aesthetic experience" namely, "apprehending our capacity to transcend our sensible, phenomenal selves through freedom." Here she claims that the invocation of "the movement from sensible to supersensible" is "essential to the structure of sublime experience for Kant" (p. 133).

Thus, it is unclear as to which part of the Kantian metaphysical story should be kept on Brady's view and why. She gestures toward an answer to this question with reference to Ronald Hepburn's idea of an ineliminable metaphysical dimension to our appreciation of nature. But the answer remains hazy. Unfortunately, without a more precise answer to this question, it is not clear whether the core concept of the sublime Brady is working out will meet the contemporary challenge raised by scientific cognitivism, namely, to appreciate nature for what it really is, on its own terms, rather than projecting upon nature subjective and possibly fanciful speculations that are in conflict with what our best science tells us about the nature of nature.

Despite these problems, Brady mounts several very persuasive arguments: She makes a strong case that the sublime is predominantly an aesthetic category relating to nature rather than art. In Chapter 5 she offers several compelling reasons why art can only be derivatively sublime having to do with art's general lack of the requisite scale, the formed nature of art as opposed to vast or powerful nature's formlessness, and art's general lack of wildness and disorder. Notable exceptions she acknowledges, however, include certain works of land art, such as Smithson's Spiral Jetty, and works of architecture such as the Empire State Building. But these works are genuinely sublime because they partake of the scale and environing quality of sublime natural places. Chapter 7 also usefully and originally delineates important contrasts and overlaps between the aesthetic categories of the sublime, terrible beauty and ugliness.

In sum, The Sublime in Modern Philosophy is an ambitious, erudite, and impressive study of the history of the aesthetic category of the sublime that makes a strong case for the ongoing relevance of the sublime as an important aesthetic category in environmental aesthetics. It should be read by anyone seriously interested in the connections between aesthetics, ethics and nature.

[1] I have made a similar argument that the concept of the sublime has fallen unjustifiably into desuetude in Anglo-American aesthetics in my “Contemporary Environmental Aesthetics and the Neglect of the Sublime” British Journal of Aesthetics 53:2, April 2013, pp. 181-198.