The Symposium

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Plato, M. C. Howatson (ed., trans.) and Frisbee C. C. Sheffield (ed.), The Symposium, Cambridge UP, 2008, xxviii + 91pp., $13.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521682985.

Reviewed by Iakovos Vasiliou, The Graduate Center and Brooklyn College, CUNY



This edition and translation of Plato’s Symposium is an addition to the wonderful Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy series. Although such a famous dialogue seems a natural one to include, when we recognize that the objective of this series is “to expand the range, variety, and quality of texts in the history of philosophy that are available in English” we might wonder about the choice. There have been at least seven English translations in the last twenty years, by such notable scholars and translators as Alexander Nehamas and Paul Woodruff (Hackett), Robin Waterfield (Oxford), and Christopher Gill (Penguin). Surely, then, this edition does nothing to expand range or variety, and so ought to be judged by whether it expands the quality of access to the Symposium for its primary intended audience of undergraduate and graduate readers. Given the quality of its competition, however, this is no small task.

The volume includes a 21-page Introduction by Frisbee Sheffield (who is also the author of a recent monograph on the dialogue [Oxford, 2006]), a very brief Chronology of historical events in the fifth and fourth centuries, a list of “further reading”, a translation by M. C. Howatson with footnotes, a Glossary of Names and a Glossary of Greek words, and a Subject Index.

Writing an introduction to a Platonic dialogue is tricky. It involves many difficult judgments about which topics to include and which to omit, how much detail to provide concerning different controversies, and how much background knowledge one ought to assume the reader has . While Sheffield’s Introduction contains much useful information — there is a particularly clear and succinct couple of pages on erotic relationships and education (viii-x) — I think that unwise choices have been made about these issues in too many cases. The Introduction focuses overwhelmingly on Socrates’ speech and its interpretation (13 pages), with three pages of summary of the preceding speeches and two devoted to Alcibiades’ speech. In some places, however, it contains too much detail, and involves controversies too complex to be appreciated by a first-time reader. In other places, by contrast, it provides too little by way of guidance for such an audience, assuming knowledge that a student new to the Symposium, and perhaps to Plato, would not have.

For example, there is no explanation of the term “soul” when it is first mentioned (xi). For a contemporary English reader, “soul” carries with it implications quite alien to the Greek concept of psuchê. Even in the Glossary under psuchê there is no mention that the soul is the seat of one’s character and so no mention of the important fact that virtues are states of one’s soul. This seems to me particularly troubling in the context of the discussion of the “ascent of desire” where the idea of loving “beautiful souls” would be quite opaque without realizing that souls are the seat of character. It is only quite late in the Introduction (xxiv) that one reads, without any comment: “Intellectual excellence is also different because it is a possession of the mind, or soul”. This would come as a surprise to an English reader without some further details, since “mind” and “soul” are not obviously interchangeable.

Footnote 23 offers another example: "The presence of Forms suggests that the Symposium is a middle-period work, perhaps close in date to the Republic". Fair enough, but there has not been (nor will there be) any explanation of the phrase “middle-period work” nor any indication that many scholars divide Plato’s corpus into periods, let alone how those periods are characterized. I am not necessarily advocating that the can of worms that is Platonic chronology ought to be discussed here; if it is not, however, a term like “middle-period work” ought to be avoided.

Assuming students and non-specialists are the intended audience, the Introduction’s exposition sometimes risks generating misunderstanding. Sheffield writes: "Socrates argues that the highest form of eros [sic] is contemplation of the Beautiful itself, an abstract and perfect idea of beauty. Happiness resides in intellectual union with this idea" (xiii). Why, a reader new to Plato might wonder, is “Beautiful” capitalized? More importantly there is no discussion here of the concept of a Platonic Form. By itself the claim that the Beautiful itself is an “abstract and perfect idea of beauty” would naturally make a reader think that it is a concept that exists in a person’s mind. This would be, of course, entirely wrong, since the Beautiful itself is a Platonic Form, which is the most fundamental type of being in Plato’s metaphysics and which exists independently of minds and the sensible world altogether. No mention, however, is made of Forms or their nature until seven pages later, when we first encounter: “[Socrates] claims that the best expression of desire is contemplation of an abstract and perfect Idea of Beauty” (xx). Why is the word “Idea” now capitalized? I realize that fussily highlighting stylistic inconsistencies may seem petty, but there are many in this volume and, if we consider it from the perspective of a careful reader approaching this text for the first time, these inconsistencies threaten to be quite confusing. Why think that a reader would know, for example, that “Idea” (as a transliteration of idea) does not mean what we mean by the word “idea” in colloquial English? It is not until halfway further down the page that we find: “The object of this apprehension is a purely intelligible object, grasped, if at all, by the intellect: the Idea, or Form, of Beauty. This beautiful object has a stable nature, it is immune from change of any kind, and it admits of no imperfections.” So, the reader discovers that the “Idea of Beauty” is not an idea at all. Finally, a page after this, Sheffield writes: “Since he [Plato] believed in the possibility of stable knowledge, he supposed that the objects of such knowledge were changeless and perfect intelligible objects — the Forms.” It is never explicitly stated that “the Beautiful itself”, “the Form of Beauty”, and the “Idea of Beauty” are all different expressions for the same thing. It would avoid potential confusion to state this, and to provide an explanation of the Forms succinctly the first time reference is made to them.

In rather stark contrast to the lack of adequate explanations for some basic aspects of Plato’s thought is a rather complex discussion of intellectualism, which strikes me as out of place here since the issue is not so central to (or resolvable within) the context of the Symposium, as Sheffield herself points out at the end of it (xvi). There is also, to my mind, a too sophisticated and lengthy discussion of the relationship among happiness, knowledge, and virtue (xxi-xxv). I find it difficult to believe that a reader new to Plato would be able to follow this very well, and in general I do not think that reading the detailed account of Socrates’ speech in the Introduction would be particularly helpful until one has read the text.

There are also several inconsistencies in the Introduction. For example, on the very first page there is mention of eros (without a long mark; see comments below on the translation) and the footnote advises the reader to consult the “Glossary” (without mentioning that there are two Glossaries, one of Names and one of Greek Words). When one turns to the Glossary of Greek Words, however, there is no entry for erôs anywhere in the left-hand column. In fact, there is mention of erôs in the Glossary (this time with a long-mark over the omega), but it is under erân, and would not easily be found, especially by a student without much knowledge of Greek and who is searching in alphabetical order. (If one mistakenly looks instead in the Glossary of Names under “Eros”, one is told to look under “Love” and “Gods”; then under “Love”, it tells one to see eran (no long mark) in “glossary”, under which you would find reference to erôs.) A similar problem occurs, though less egregiously, with elenchus, a word that can only be found under elenchein. Inconsistent use of capitals with the word “form” risk leading a reader to think mistakenly that different concepts are being referred to. For example, at one point we read: “Whereas the form is stable, immune from change and uniform, the things that share in the nature of this form are unstable”. A few lines later we get: “[knowledge] must be had, if at all, by grasping the relevant Form” (xxi).

Confusing moments arise in the Chronology as well. It reads: “514: Hipparchus murdered by Harmodius and Aristogiton.” If a person has forgotten (as I had), or has never learned, who Hipparchus is and then turns to the Glossary of Names, she finds no entry for Hipparchus; neither is there one for Hippias, who is mentioned in the next entry for 510. Rather, the relevant information about both of them is to be found under “Harmodius”, but again that is not where a person would turn upon first encountering the unfamiliar names Hipparchus or Hippias.

Overall the translation is quite readable and accurate. In general, the English is a bit more formal and less colloquial than, for example, the Nehamas and Woodruff translation, as well as sometimes closer to the original. Consider Alcibiades’ first words. Nehamas and Woodruff translate as follows: “‘Good evening, gentlemen, I’m plastered’, he [Alcibiades] announced, ‘May I join your party? Or should I crown Agathon with this wreath — which is all I came to do anyway — and make myself scarce?’” Howatson translates as follows: “‘Good evening, gentlemen,’ he [Alcibiades] said. ‘Will you welcome as a fellow drinker a man already very drunk, or must I merely crown Agathon, which is what I came for, and go away again?’” While Howatson’s rendering is closer to the Greek word for word, the Nehamas/Woodruff version better captures the spirit of Alcibiades’ hubristic, drunkenly enthusiastic entrance, which is especially so in these first moments before he realizes that Socrates is present.

There are some idiosyncratic choices in the translation (perhaps in order to make it distinct from some of its competitors). For example, kalon and aischron in Pausanias’ speech are translated as “right” and “wrong” (Howatson notes the controversial nature of this in footnote 55). Howatson renders eikones — a notorious word in the context of Plato’s metaphysics, traditionally translated as “images” (and so translated by her at 212a) — as “comparisons” when Alcibiades, that most unphilosophical character, says that he will describe Socrates’ character via the image of satyrs and Silenus (215a). There is no note of this switch, however, and eikôn does not appear in the Glossary of Greek Words.

In sum, while I think a Greek-less reader would be generally well-served by the translation itself and not led unduly astray, I am not confident that the translation is overall a significant improvement upon others, such as the Nehamas and Woodruff version.

One serious caveat about the general quality of the translation and its presentation, however, concerns its use of footnotes and the accompanying Glossary of Greek Words. As in the Introduction, there are inconsistencies that seem potentially quite confusing. First, each entry in the Glossary of Greek Words consists of a Greek word transliterated in the left column, and a corresponding explanation in the right column, between one and several lines in length, that begins with the word in Greek and then explains the word’s range of meanings. Unfortunately, it is often not clear here where the translation of the word ends (or in some cases begins) and the gloss on the meaning of the word begins (or in some cases ends). Furthermore, the transliterated words in the Glossary include, as is traditional, long marks over ‘e’ for eta and over ‘o’ for omega. In the footnotes to the translation (and also in the Introduction), however, there are no long marks over any of the letters whatsoever: thus psuche, phronesis, poiesis, and so on in the footnotes, rather than psuchê, phronêsis, and poiêsis, as they are correctly printed in the Glossary.

Again, I do not mean to pick over minutiae, but since the volume is for undergraduate and graduate students with most probably little or no Greek these inconsistencies stand to be quite confusing if readers attempt to keep track of key terms — and this is precisely what the footnotes themselves encourage them to do. The editors include a large number of footnotes that indicate the Greek word translated, but they do so in an odd and inconsistent way. For example, three times the word “soul” is marked with a footnote that says “psuche” [sic] (nn. 46, 59, 79); other times, however, it is not (e.g. at 195e). Why, though, footnote this word at all, since as far as I can tell no other Greek word is ever rendered by “soul”? Similarly, providing footnotes to indicate that “sophists” translates sophistes or that “virtue” translates aretê seems redundant or random, especially since not every occurrence of these words is so marked. The upshot is that a Greek-less reader cannot be confident that every occurrence of key words is marked or how, nor would they be able to tell why or when words were not marked.

Overall, while there is much useful information in this edition of the Symposium, I do not recommend it as the best available for undergraduates or students of the dialogue in general.