The Tangle of Science: Reliability Beyond Method, Rigour, and Objectivity


Nancy Cartwright, Jeremy Hardie, Eleonora Montuschi, Matthew Soleiman, and Ann C. Thresher, The Tangle of Science: Reliability Beyond Method, Rigour, and Objectivity, Oxford University Press, 2023, 272pp., $41.99 (hbk), ISBN 9780198866343.

Reviewed by Lydia Patton, Virginia Tech


The value of science is difficult to pin down. Two competing strands of philosophy do this work. One is the study of confirmation and truth, encompassing formal epistemology, philosophy of science, and allied fields. Another is the study of epistemic and non-epistemic values in science. The Tangle of Science occupies a liminal space between these two projects. The authors note (9) that the work of Naomi Oreskes, Helen Longino, Karin Knorr Cetina, and Philip Kitcher lives in the same neighborhood as Tangle: investigating why we place such high value on science, and what backs up that value in practice. The authors further cite Bernard Williams, Otto Neurath, Pierre Duhem, and W.V.O. Quine as forebears, and Alison Wylie, Hasok Chang, and Andrea Woody as contemporaries working in a similar vein.

One traditional approach to defending the value of science is veritism: the position that science is valuable because it is true. As the first Part of The Tangle of Science makes clear, defenses of veritism may rely on a set of scientific virtues which are taken to be embedded with truth. The first Part of Tangle sets out new accounts of three of these—rigour, objectivity, and scientific method. Part 2, and Tangle overall, defends several positions on the value of science: that science is a product; that scientific processes are reliable not as single statements but as complex bodies; and that science serves the purposes desired for it by embodying ‘virtuous tangles’.

An initial way to understand what is meant by a tangle is to contrast virtuous tangles with true claims. Veritism relies in part on the view that truth satisfies practical needs: Planes fly because Bernoulli’s principle is true. If we were to try to build practical theories on falsehoods, or so the claim goes, we would soon find ourselves practically as well as epistemically adrift. Veritism is thus naturally allied with foundationalism, the view that knowledge rests on a base of true claims which provide a warrant for claims derived from them.

One of the most intriguing claims in Tangle is that the identification of truth with practical success is too quick. A statement may be true, but its material consequences for a given practical situation may not be obvious or easy to specify. And the truth of a scientific claim may not make it the best candidate for practical reliability.

The authors first present their argument in the introduction. They begin from their view that science is not merely a collection of claims, it is a product: “We urge a dramatic broadening of focus: from concentrating on claims and theories to focusing on all the products of science and not on their truth but on their reliability and the purposes they can reliably serve” (3). Scientific products require instructions for proper application (3–4). For science to be practically successful, there has to be clear instructions for its use in a given situation. Since real situations are complex, specifying those instructions can go well beyond a description of what makes a claim ‘true’. Even when a claim is true, the authors note, the fact that it can be used reliably in a given context will usually depend on a ‘virtuous tangle’ of practices, methods, routines, and tacit knowledge developed over the long haul of science. No claim stands alone.

It is possible to read the book solely as an argument against foundationalism and veritism, but I do not think that is quite right. The Tangle of Science is a much broader project. A main argument of the book is that truth and confirmation do not exhaust the account of the value of science. If philosophers concentrate solely on confirmation and truth, they will miss much of what makes science worthwhile.

In the first part of The Tangle of Science, the authors investigate the ‘usual suspects’ for pinning down the value of science: scientific method, rigour, and objectivity. The authors’ position that science is a process culminating in specific products informs their explanation of each concept.

In Chapter 1, the authors note that to serve the purposes desired for it “the scientific method should specify what is to be done not only in general but also in concrete circumstances” (21). But when we try to make rules or guidance more specific to a certain situation, we lose the “universal prescriptive force” of the method in question (21).

Chapter 3 deals with the fraught concept of ‘objectivity’. Science is meant to be valuable in part because it removes subjective or biased considerations from our deliberations. Objectivity is hard to pin down as a concept. Following Heather Douglas, the authors investigate a “list” definition, that is to say a list setting out a set of virtues embodied by objectivity —a strategy, as Douglas notes, which thereby makes the concept irreducibly complex (§ There follows a discussion of Lorraine Daston’s and Peter Galison’s “precisification” strategy (§ which is to specify “how the concept has played out in different epochs in the history of science concerned with different epistemic threats” (95).

The Tangle of Science distinguishes “Objectivity As We Know It” from “Objectivity To Be Found” (86–7). Objectivity as we know it is “both hugely abstract and hugely imprecise” (103). As Carl Hempel argued, when we make the concept more precise, we risk “alienating” it from its intended meaning (108). But to make sense of objectivity in science as it is practiced, we must make the concept more precise. The authors propose pursuing objectivity as it is to be found in specific situations, and propose analyzing objectivity as one of Otto Neurath’s “Ballung” concepts instead of as a universal abstract notion.

The second Part sets out what makes tangles virtuous, in chapter 4. Veritistic approaches focus on truth as a target, and use confirmation techniques to dig deeper foundations for our claims. Those techniques don’t aim—at least not in the first instance—to establish those claims’ practical consequences, or how they might guide our approach to the world. The approach of Tangle, in contrast, takes its cue from Bernard Williams’ analysis that claims should be both guided by the world and action-guiding.

Instead of singling out the virtue of truth and arguing that truth is established by confirmation, the authors argue that virtuous tangles create rigorous constraints on the application of claims in practice. But they argue for a more ambitious claim as well: that “standard theories of truth and confirmation presuppose tangles” (132). As the authors note, “no interesting scientific claim H comes confirmed” in a ready-made fashion (133). Instead, scientists must work up a claim, investigating its scope and limitations, and the evidence for it. But as it turns out, “There is no such thing as evidence—there are just facts—until a vast body of scientific work turns these into evidence” (133). The authors argue that, as scientists investigate the claims made by a body of work, they are uncovering tangles engaged by the reliable processes that support those claims. The tangles are not a foundation for the claims, but they do explain the linkages between beliefs, constraints, and reliable scientific practices. In this second part of the book, historical and contemporary accounts are given for how these complex systems work in practice.

Giving a robust account of tangles yields an account of science in practice for free. That is a strength of this book. A foundationalist or veritist account screens off true claims from the hands-on business of science, and then faces the task of explaining how those claims are applied in practice. Tangle begins instead from the position that claims are robust because they embody key elements of virtuous, reliable scientific processes. Those processes operate within certain established constraints—constraints established through normal scientific operations (measurement, hypothesis testing, parameter estimation, and so on). On this account, the boundaries and scope of the operation of a given claim—the constraints on its valid application—are baked into it.

The main question raised in my mind while reading this book was about how easily this will all work in practice. According to The Tangle of Science, constraints are meant to explain why we identify certain processes as reliable: they work given certain conditions and boundaries, within certain limits, to produce what we want from science. But one of the examples given here, the Vajont dam disaster, is a good case showing why identifying constraints ahead of time is difficult in practice. (Read the book to find out why!) The problem I have in mind is the following. There might be a practical constraint that is urgent and relevant, but that there is no reason for a scientist to think of before putting a process into gear. The problem is usually clear in retrospect—for instance, when an apparently common illness turns out to have been a rare disease, misdiagnosed because a seemingly irrelevant minor symptom was overlooked. In practice, it’s hard to identify relevant evidence, or relevant constraints, at the time. This is not really a complaint about the book—it’s a complaint about the human condition. Science is hard.

The Tangle of Science does just what it says on the tin. It is a valuable contribution to the growing literature on science in practice and the epistemology of science. The book provides an attractive depiction of science, and explains why we would value science so highly. Science consists of reliable processes that generate products under certain constraints, which are explored jointly with the processes themselves. Scientific knowledge thus deepens over time. We don’t just learn more about the foundation of specific claims—exploring virtuous tangles tells us more over time about the processes those claims embody and the conditions under which they operate properly.