The Tarskian Turn: Deflationism and Axiomatic Truth

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Leon Horsten, The Tarskian Turn: Deflationism and Axiomatic Truth, MIT Press, 2011, 163pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262015868.

Reviewed by Riccardo Bruni, University of Florence, Italy


Since the 1930s, the investigation of truth has provided occasions for exercising conceptual analysis and formal methods. Research on this topic has attracted both philosophers and logicians. Its early fame was due to the seminal paper by Alfred Tarski, "The concept of truth in formalized languages". Its recent fame, instead, is mostly connected with the debate on deflationism, which aims at reducing, so to say, the philosophical impact of truth. Mention of both these topics is made in the title of Leon Horsten's book. The book itself is indeed an account of their connection, more in a conceptual sense of the expression rather than in an historical one.

In the last few months, at least two other important books on truth have been published, following a number of conferences and workshops devoted to the topic. Horsten's book stands out, at least for the fact that it conveys a view, called inferential deflationism, which is conceived as a new starting point for the research to follow. I will come back to it later on in this review.

Another feature of the book is its attention to the axiomatic foundations of truth. This is advertised by its title too. Notoriously, theories of truth can be divided intosemantic and axiomatic ones. Both Tarski's theory and Kripke's, to mention another popular one, belong to the former group. To the other group belong a number of different formal systems, which, generally speaking, are all motivated by leaving behind the goal of defining truth (in order to capture its essence, to say it philosophically), in favour of isolating principles which may reflect basic intuitions regarding its fundamental properties.

The preference for axiomatic theories of truth is justified by Horsten on the basis of a crucial defect of semantic approaches: they cannot make sense of self-applying truth, which is exactly how truth works in natural languages. When the issue is addressed semantically, one is quite naturally brought to consider hierarchies of languages, each of which provides a definition of truth for some lower-level one.

This is not to say that reference to semantics is left unnoticed by Horsten. Quite the contrary, he often praises axiomatic theories because they admit interesting models ("nice" ones, as Horsten says), or classes of models.

In particular, the theories presented in the book are evaluated on the basis of a three-fold notion of soundness (pp. 24-26). In a first sense (metamathematical), a theory is sound if it is consistent, hence if it admits a model. This is a minimal, though partial requirement. A theory of truth needs to be sound also in the (philosophical) sense of featuring axioms and rules which are intuitively valid, and such that intuitive validity is preserved when passing to their logical consequences. Finally, a theory of truth is required to be sound in the (truth-theoretical) sense of reflecting desirable properties of the truth predicate.

The other measure for evaluating a theory of truth is its (proof-theoretical) strength, which, in view of Horsten's attention to and sympathy for deflationism, he refers to in an unexpected manner that is worth mentioning (see below).

The fact that the focus is on axiomatics, hence on the logical side of the topic, does not mean that the book is only for specialists in the field. The reader is introduced to the core of the book by a clear and easy-to-read chapter of preliminaries (ch. 3). The usage of formalism and reference to technicalities here, as well as in the rest of the book, are always well-balanced between the attempt of making clear all requirements, and that of avoiding an obsession for details which would hide the conceptual import of the technical results. Anyway, most of the required notions are those usually addressed in standard logic courses and textbooks, and include Gödel's completeness and incompleteness theorems, the Diagonal Lemma, and Tarski's theorem on the undefinability of arithmetical truth. Notoriously, there are some tricky issues underlying these and other results which are relevant for the logical investigation on truth, and which are due to the coding of the syntax of a formal language. As far as the content of this book is concerned, however, most of these intricacies are irrelevant.

The central part of the book starts with a chapter (ch. 4) devoted to the disquotational theory DT, whose truth axioms are all of the instances of the schema

T(φ) ↔ φ

for every formula φ of the base language (which is the language of Peano Arithmetic), hence not containing occurrences of the truth predicate itself.[1] This theory has some notable features: the truth-theoretical axioms of DT are the simplest one can think of, as they reflect the idea that truth is basically a disquotation device. In addition, the theory is sound, in the overall sense of the expression. But it is parasitic on Tarski's approach, and on his distinction between the object language and the metalanguage in justifying the restriction in scope of the truth predicate.

Horsten shows this (pp. 53-55) by building up a hierarchy of theories DTα through all the finite levels α's, and beyond. Climbing up this "ladder" turns out to be the clearest evidence of the artificiality involved therein.

Furthermore, DT fails to validate some natural intuitions concerning the behaviour of the truth predicate -- in particular, intuitions about truth commuting with logical connectives. This is an urgent fact for deflationists who, as Horsten makes clear (pp. 65-66), assume that truth is a logico-linguistic notion. The truth predicate behaves as a logical notion, as it allows one to express generality. In particular, the usage of the truth predicate allows us to express infinite conjuctions, and by that it contributes to enhancing the expressive power of our language.[2] However, the bearers of truth are interpreted sentences of the language. In this sense, truth is also a linguistic notion.

The easiest way to solve the weakness of DT is to incorporate the intended principles in the axioms. By doing that, one obtains the compositional theory of truth TC (p. 71). The consideration of this theory allows Horsten to introduce the issue of conservativity, which has attracted some attention among scholars debating deflationism.

Deflationists claim that truth is insubstantial. The question is whether this stance also entails that truth must not be creative with respect to the base language. In formal terms, the situation is as follows: one is given a base language L and a base axiomatic theory B whose axioms are formulas of L. The truth language LT is obtained by adding the truth predicate T to L. A truth theory T is obtained by adding to B the axioms for the truth predicate (which are formulas of LT). In a sense,is more powerful than B. But does it also prove formulas φ of the base language L which were unprovable (and unrefutable) before?

Stewart Shapiro is among those who think that if this were the case, then the truth predicate would fail to be insubtstantial.[3] Volker Halbach has shown that there is no way to avoid such an impact of any reasonable truth theory over the logic.[4] Results vary if one takes B to be some theory extending the logical base, as Horsten does by choosing Peano Arithmetic (which is customary in the field). The author then shows that one easily (and unsurprisingly) proves that DT is conservative over PA, while TC is not (pp. 74-78). The latter theory in fact proves the same arithmetical theorems as a subsystem of analysis which is known as ACA (the theory where the axiom of comprehension is restricted to arithmetically definable sets of natural numbers).

Ch. 7 contains Horsten’s own evaluation of this result for the deflationist's attitude. Horsten emphasizes two possible ways out. The deflationist may refute the conservativity argument as a whole. The alternative is to distance himself from his original position. Horsten seems to prefer this route, as he illustrates how the idea that truth is not conservative over some basic knowledge appears to be a plausible one on the basis of some case studies. The most convincing of them deals with the use of truth in epistemology (pp. 86-91). Horsten shows how (part of) TC can be used in restating an argument by Fitch against verificationism, in a way which seems not to be dispensable.

Having shown that truth plausibly has substantial consequences in certain areas of knowledge, Horsten turns to formal theories of truth which guarantee extra-deductive power over arithmetic. This "game", as he refers to it, is taken up in the subsequent part of the book, and it introduces consideration of type-free theories of truth.

Once a given language L has been upgraded to a truth language, there are two possible ways of writing the axioms for the truth predicate as formulas of LT. On the one hand, it is possible to place specific restrictions which prevent the truth predicate from applying to formulas which contain occurrences of it. In this case, the axioms of the truth theory will feature occurrences of formulas of the form T(φ), where φ varies over formulas of the base language L (as was the case for the Tarskian biconditionals of DT). Otherwise, any condition of that sort is dropped, and the truth predicate is allowed to freely apply to formulas of L(as long as consistency is guaranteed). In the former case, one speaks of a typed theory of truth, while, in the latter case, the resulting truth theory is untyped.

Among type-free theories, a famous one is the axiom system FS named after Harvey Friedman and Michael Sheard.[5] (ch. 8) This system can be taken to be the type-free counterpart of the typed theory of compositional truth.[6] This means that its truth axioms are highly intuitive and sound. The theory has a nice semantics, which makes use of the machinery of the revision theory of truth by Gupta, Belnap and Herzberger.[7] (§8.3) With respect to Horsten's search for deductive power, FS corresponds to the first transfinite level in the hierarchy which is built up over TC, and features theories TCn+1 which contain the axioms for compositional truth of theories TCn, for every natural number n.

However, the theory notoriously suffers from a major defect: in terms of arithmetical models, it admits only non-standard expansions of the standard model of arithmetic (pp. 109-110). As a matter of fact, the theory is ω-inconsistent, as logicians say.

In the end, this latter feature brings Horsten to consider FS an unsatisfactory foundation for self-referential truth (pp. 111-115), even though FS has some nice properties in terms of intuitive soundness in particular. For instance, it treats the liar sentence λ as "it should", that is, by neither proving λ nor refuting it.

Horsten's next step is to focus on Kripke's construction for self-referential truth (ch. 9). After reviewing some basic features of this semantics (pp. 117-124), Horsten presents Solomon Feferman's KF as a first attempt of an axiomatic foundation of Kripke's work. The theory is satisfactory from the point of view of its soundness. As far as its deductive strength is concerned, KF exceeds the arithmetical power of TC to an even higher extent than FS (pp. 125-126). However, the theory is based on classical logic. Per se, this would not be a defect of course. It can be considered to be as such, however, in the case of a system of axioms for Kripke's semantics, which is known to be non-classical (as it is based on strong Kleene three-valued logic, in particular). In KF this aspect of the intended semantics is reflected by the truth-theoretic axioms, which describe T as having non-classical compositional properties. However, the overall notion of logical consequence of the theory is the usual, classical one. This has the consequence that the internal logic of KF, that is, the collection of formulas of the form T(φ) which are provable in KF, differs from the external logic of it, which is the collection of all of its theorems (the two sets differ in the sense that, for some formula φ, KF proves φ but it fails to prove T(φ)). That is, KF does not fully reflect internally (to say it informally, believe as true), everything that it proves (and that it should believe as true).

This feature of KF can be superseded by axiomatizing Kripke's proposal over a system for partial logic. The resulting theory, which is known as PKF, is due to Halbach and Horsten himself. Horsten discusses the formal and conceptual features of PKF at length (pp. 132-139). In the final chapter of the book, Horsten sums up this discussion by supporting PKF as his candidate theory of truth.

Now, Horsten's suggestion is highly criticizable, especially if one considers the fact that the use of partial logic (i) seriously affects the possibility of reproducing some natural and intuitive lines of reasoning in PKF, and (ii) similarly affects its mathematical power.[8] However, pursuing this criticism too far would not take into account that Horsten's endorsment of PKF is largely instrumental in character. That is, PKF is the best theory of truth among the available ones, which appears to be compatible with the underlying conceptual refinement of deflationism that Horsten is interested in proposing (pp. 143ff).

The major tenets of this inferential deflationism, as the author calls it, can be roughly summarized as follows: (1) truth is a simple notion; (2) truth is by essenceinferential in character, as it follows from its logical nature, and does not differ from the other logical concepts of the language (whose essence is best explicated inferentially); (3) truth inferences enhance the expressive power of our language(s), where this can be read as meaning "increasing our deductive power" in contexts where it is appropriate to do so (for instance, in connection with the investigation of the foundations of mathematics); and (4) the project of reflecting the intuitive properties of truth at a formal level is ongoing, hence open to refinements.

There are several pleasing aspects of this view. It comprises what may appear to be a more convincing form of deflationism. It suggests that theories based on rules of inference, such as PKF, are preferable, though there is no limit to the deductive power these rules should have. This helps to make the view palatable to logicians, who may well stick to it without feeling artificially constrained while making use of truth as a powerful tool. It reasonably opens up to future contributions, which may overcome the defects of a theory such as PKF, hence avoiding any dogmatic endorsement of this formal system.

As I said before, the fact that Horsten's clever account of the recent research on truth ends with an original viewpoint is well worth an emphasis. How much this view will turn out to be successful is something to be seen in the future. At the moment, it seems to me to be a good reason for recommending Horsten's work both to the specialist and to the beginner in the field.

[1] Following Horsten's convention, I omit reference to codes of formulas for the sake of readability.

[2] See V. Halbach, "Disquotationalism and Infinite Conjunctions", Mind, 108, 1999, pp. 1-22.

[3] S. Shapiro, "Proof and truth: through thick and thin", The Journal of Philosophy, 95, 1998, pp. 493-521.

[4] V. Halbach, "How innocent is deflationism?", Synthese, 126, 2001, pp. 167-194.

[5] H Friedman, M. Sheard, "Axiomatic Theories of Self-Referential Truth", Annals of Pure and Applied Logic, 33, 1987, pp. 1-21.

[6] In particular, of the variant of TC with axioms for compositional truth where the truth predicate occurs only positively, i.e., non-negated (see §7.6.2 of Horsten's book for a presentation of this system of axioms).

[7] A. Gupta, N. Belnap, The Revision Theory of Truth, MIT Press, 1993.

[8] For a recent account in this sense, the reader is referred to V. Halbach, Axiomatic Theories of Truth, Cambridge University Press, 2011, §20.1.