The Task of the Interpreter: Text, Meaning, and Negotiation

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Pol Vandevelde, The Task of the Interpreter: Text, Meaning, and Negotiation, University of Pittsburgh Press, 2005, 256pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780822958840.

Reviewed by Michael Krausz, Bryn Mawr College


In his fresh and compendious book, The Task of the Interpreter, Vandevelde draws upon, with equal mastery, various philosophical traditions to illuminate central issues in the philosophy of interpretation. Vandevelde tells us that it is the duty of a writer to tell the truth, and the duty of an interpreter to negotiate threefold interests: original intent in the text, literal meaning of the text, and the indeterminacy of its representative content. (223) He affirms that interpretation is a rational activity that presumes a claim of validity. Emphasizing the speech act approach, Vandevelde ties the claim of validity to standards associated with a pertinent community, the abdication of which involves exclusion from that community.

Not to submit to such a process of validation current in a community of interpreters [he says] would amount, for a particular interpreter, to not being recognized as an interpreter, not being published, and thus being excluded from the community. (106-7)

When speaking about validity Vandevelde concentrates on bivalent truth. Of course, validity can be understood also in terms of multivalent values such as reasonableness, appropriateness, plausibility or the like. That is why it might be better to speak of "admissibility" rather than "validity," the first being more hospitable to Vandevelde's own community-centered approach. As well, when Vandevelde speaks of a "process of validation," he concentrates on justification as verification, that is, as demonstration of truth. Yet verification and falsification are asymmetrical. In the verificationist sense, justification seeks singular truth. In the falsificationist sense, justification seeks the elimination of falsity, which leaves open whether there must be a single true interpretation. In any event, we should not restrict our understanding of justification to the verificationist sense. We should leave open the question of singular truth.

Vandevelde thoroughly discusses the related issue of critical monism versus critical pluralism.

Critical pluralism [he says] holds that there are a multiplicity of equally valid interpretations, resulting from the different backgrounds of interpreters who do not read with the same interests, concerns and knowledge … Opposed to pluralism in interpretation, critical monism or singularism defends the view that for a given text there is ideally only one correct interpretation. (2-3)

I prefer the nomenclature of multiplism rather than critical pluralism, for the first allows for reasoned preferences amongst admissible interpretations and the second does not. Typically, in discussing admissibility or validity one deploys determinative reasons. A determinative reason is one you offer to convince someone else of the admissibility or validity of your view. In contrast, an ampliative reason is one you offer someone to give an account of why you embrace the interpretation that you do. It indicates grounds why you adopt a view within your network of beliefs without trying to convince someone else of its rightness. Ampliative reasons avoid arbitrariness in one's choice among admissible interpretations. While they provide grounds for preferences, they do not entail a singularist condition.

It appears that critical monism and critical pluralism are incompatible and require resolution. But Vandevelde understands them to be "co-habitable." He holds that the distinction is a false one, for they do not constitute a dichotomy. Rather, they address distinctly different aspects of interpretation. These aspects are event and act. He says:

By event I mean the fact that we as speakers and interpreters participate in a culture and a language that carry with them concepts, values, and habits of which we might not be aware, so that our interpretation is also something taking place in a tradition. By act, I mean an act of consciousness: someone interpreting a text makes a statement or an utterance and through his or her act is committed regarding the truth of what is said. (4)

Whatever multiplicity that might obtain at the event level does not necessarily carry over to multiplicity at the act level. Being at different levels, critical monism and critical pluralism are co-habitable. Vandevelde notes that many advocates of critical pluralism mistakenly focus exclusively on the event of interpretation.

If we take the first-person perspective of the interpreter when presenting a new interpretation, we see that the interpreter does not have available a knowledge of the influences and prejudices marring the enterprise of interpretation. (5)

Vandevelde rightly holds that unless one seeks truth (I say "truth-likeness"), one is not engaged in interpreting. Of course, one might do other things with texts than interpret them. But sometimes it is unclear whether one is engaged in interpretation or something else. Consider, for example, the Hindu speech act, "Thou Art That," understood as a mantra to further "self-realization." Taken as a mantra it is not an assertion about the ultimate nature of reality. The point of the mantra qua mantra is not to assert the truth that an individual self is an embodiment or manifestation of the Supreme Self. As a mantra, its function is transformative. It is meant to aid in altering consciousness leading to realization. Transformative practices as such are not interpretive. Yet the mantric speech act in some sense depends upon accepting the assertion that an individual self is an embodiment or manifestation of the Supreme Self. While the mantric speech act is not interpretive, its "presupposed" speech act is. What then is the relationship between them? Perhaps we might think of it in terms of Wittgenstein's proverbial ladder. One aim of the mantric exercise is to discard the assertoric speech act, which is necessary for the initiation of the mantric speech act to start with. In such a situation it is difficult to tell where one sort of activity ends and another begins.

Correspondingly, if the mantric speech act depends upon the acceptance of the assertoric speech act, and if its pertinence is subject to a seeker's stage of "realization," the relationship between the mantric and assertoric speech acts will vary. More generally, we need an account of the relationship between speech acts and the levels at which they operate, which in this case would implicate the soteriological condition of one who plays different roles in relation to the different communities: interpreting inquirers or meditative seekers.

More fully, Vandevelde is right to tie the idea of justification to a community. When uttering "Thou Art That," one could be addressing an intellectual community of inquirers, or a nonintellectual community of meditators, or both simultaneously. If one takes "Thou Art That," as an assertion about a putative fact of the matter -- that is, about a state of affairs about the ultimate nature of reality -- then one addresses a community of intellectuals, assuming usual canons of rational argumentation. When the mantra is taken as an aid in self-transformation or self-realization, other standards are involved. Yet typically we are members of different communities, sometimes pursuing different aims. So we need to give grounds for distinguishing one community from another, which will in turn reflect upon the aims and procedures that will tell us what is an appropriate way to understand a pertinent speech act, and with it the sorts of justificatory reasons pertinent to each.

This example highlights the difficulty of distinguishing one speech act from another, and the difficulty of distinguishing between their interpretive and non-interpretive aims. Each speech act addresses different communities with different aims. Sometimes it is difficult to tell to which community a given speech act is addressed. Yet these sorts of difficulties amount to no criticism of Vandevelde's views. Rather, they present themselves as subjects still to be treated by applying the rich conceptual resources that Vandevelde does provide. The Task of the Interpreter is engaging and provocative. I heartily recommend it.