The Textual Genesis of Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations

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Nuno Venturinha (ed.), The Textual Genesis of Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations, Routledge, 2013, 226pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415640688.

Reviewed by James W. Hearne, Western Washington University


In principle, a collection on purely textual and philological aspects of the Philosophical Investigations (PI) might serve as a useful corrective to the somewhat oracular literature that has grown up around the work and around Wittgenstein more generally. This collection serves this purpose only in part. In the first place, in addition to the introduction, only five of the ten essays even nominally address textual matters. The others are standard, and sometimes worthy, contributions to Wittgensteinlehre, directed to Wittgenstein's understanding of logic and mathematics. These two foci I will treat separately, even though in a larger sense they are both concerned with the matter of Wittgenstein's gradual intellectual journey in the 1930's between the time he resumed his life as a philosopher and his arrival to something else; how he worked his way from his post-Tractatus understanding to the later nachlass and especially the PI. As I read it, the trouble with assessing this transition is that (1) it is questionable whether Wittgenstein was the kind of writer who is illuminated by close textual investigation, and (2) neither the starting point nor, especially, its terminus is especially intelligible to anyone, making the illumination of stages in between problematic. I note that the volume also includes the text and a very competent translation of a passage in Wittgenstein's notebook, but its relevance to the collection as a whole is as yet puzzling to me.

Whether or not he means to do so, the utility of close textual investigation is called into question by Nuno Venturinha's introduction, which is the most interesting of the contributions. In it, he compares the textual problem raised by Wittgenstein's PI and Pascal's Pensées. Though Wittgenstein develops philosophical arguments and Pascal had the overarching purpose of contributing to Christian apologetics, both are essentially aphoristic writers, and the identification of a correct ordering of aphorisms is much more problematic than the ordering of what is intended to be connected prose. Indeed, the point and limitation of aphoristic thinking is that one jumps from one perception to another in the hope that, withal, some new comprehension may emerge. It is simply not obvious that tracking remarks, and their modification, through the manuscripts to their final position will illuminate deeper matters.[1]

Of the essays nominally directed to textual matters, interesting topics are addressed, but all are already standardized in the Wittgenstein literature and are inconclusive. Gabriel Citron discusses G. E. Moore's early notes of Wittgenstein's lectures on Religion, locating themes documented in Moore's notes that find a later appearance in the PI. But Citron in no way advances a comprehensive understanding of what Moore recorded; indeed, little of Moore's transcript is discussed. We know from many sources that Wittgenstein was at least intermittently engaged with religiosity, but how his attention to religious uses of language informed his understanding of language in other areas is not illuminated by this essay. A second concern, the genre classification of Wittgenstein's writing as technically Syncretistic is taken up by Alois Pichler, but, unfortunately, the conclusion does not illuminate any question of philosophical interpretation that I can discern. A similar observation can be made about James Klagge's discussion of whether Wittgenstein intended his work to address the philosophical community widely or crafted his teaching and writing for a special audience capable of properly receiving it. This section of the collection also includes discussion of the Blue Book, and the relationship of the Big Typescript to later developments in Wittgenstein's thought by, respectively Jonathon Smith and Joachim Schulte, but the conclusions seem to undermine the reconstructive goal, urging that the repetition of a text is not the repetition of the same communicative intent.

The second half of the collection is characteristic of the literature on the later Wittgenstein. P. M. S. Hacker offers a carefully argued piece on Wittgenstein's progressive dismantling of strategies of Kantian transcendental argumentation, but I am not convinced that there could have been a conscious program. I find his thesis unpersuasive for reasons described below, but it is indeed carefully argued. Carefully argued also is Oskari Kuusela's attempt to spell out Wittgenstein's withdrawal from his early, austere conception of logic without devolving into an empirical psychologism. Two essays (one by Severin Schroeder, the other by André Maury) address logic and mathematics, the perennial matter of Wittgenstein's preoccupation with rules and rule-following. Andrew Lugg's article draws together possible reservations about the continuing enterprise the book represents. He considers Wittgenstein's changing understanding in the 1930's and his technical use of the term 'language-game' (Sprachspiel). Lugg questions whether the adoption marked a sudden shift away from Wittgenstein's understanding of language as a calculus. Lugg's essay exemplifies both the virtues and shortcomings of the Wittgenstein literature. What he convincingly shows us is that at no point in the manuscripts did Wittgenstein evince a sudden, new understanding of language. Lugg documents that Wittgenstein's attraction to the game metaphor was gradual. What is absent is a characterization of the end-points, what Wittgenstein was drawing attention to in using either term. Without some extra understanding of what the terms mean, urging a conception of language as either a calculus or a game is unhelpful.

In sum, with the exception of the introduction, what many of the essays have in common is the conviction that by classifying, sorting and organizing linguistic and textual minutiae, we will be able to discern a consistent, underlying theory, a theory never quite explicitly formulated by Wittgenstein himself. But the evidence that Wittgenstein eschewed philosophical theorizing is overwhelming. In addition, by all biographical accounts, Wittgenstein was a complex and wildly erratic personality, and it would not be surprising if this did not find expression in his philosophical postures. Wittgenstein here bears comparison with Nietzsche, a comparison noted by Venturinha. Both were aphoristic brilliants and both inspired intellectual communities convinced that, because of the sheer force of their thinking, there was a recoverable, coherent doctrine beneath. I believe that Wittgenstein's aphoristic thinking is far more valuable than Nietzsche's. But Wittgenstein's insights generally take the form, not of answering philosophical questions, but rather of showing us that the phenomena of interest are far more complex than the doctrines advanced to explain them would suggest and that what answers there are cannot have the form one originally hoped for and expected. For this reason, we might in the end doubt that textual reconstructions will be of much help to those who invest themselves in exploring Wittgenstein's writings.

[1] A possible exception to this claim might be the use of techniques of corpus linguistics to illuminate large-scale statistical patterns in the movement and modification of remarks from one manuscript to another, but this is far outside the scope and spirit of the book under review.