The Themes of Quine's Philosophy: Meaning, Reference, and Knowledge

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Edward Becker, The Themes of Quine's Philosophy: Meaning, Reference, and Knowledge, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 336pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107015234.

Reviewed by Gary Ebbs, Indiana University, Bloomington


In this thoughtful and detailed commentary on W.V. Quine's work, Edward Becker aims to explain and evaluate Quine's arguments for four conclusions that are integral to his philosophy: logic is not true by convention, there is no epistemologically significant analytic-synthetic distinction, translation is indeterminate, and ontology is relative. The first four chapters reconstruct Quine's arguments for these conclusions. The fifth and last chapter aims to refute Quine's thesis that translation is indeterminate and to defend analyticity, while relying only on premises that a Quinean naturalist can accept.

By comparison with other central works in analytic philosophy, Quine's writings, though apparently lucid and self-contained, are especially difficult to understand. Becker's response to the difficulties is to slow down, pay careful attention to Quine's words, raise questions about how to interpret them, and try to answer the questions patiently and thoroughly. Unlike many other Quine interpreters, including Richard Creath, Michael Friedman, Warren Goldfarb, Peter Hylton, Alan Richardson, and Thomas Ricketts, Becker does not look for interpretive clues in Quine's letters and unpublished lectures, or interpret Quine in light of evidence of his intellectual debts to Rudolf Carnap. Becker also rarely cites or discusses the secondary literature on Quine, much of which is not listed in his bibliography. His main interpretive strategy is to assume that each of Quine's central writings is largely self-contained, and should be interpreted solely on the basis of a careful examination of the words it contains. This strategy has the great merit of focusing the reader's attention on the details of Quine's carefully crafted texts. As I shall try to show by discussing a few of Becker's interpretations of Quine, however, the strategy is not well-suited to uncovering Quine's deepest philosophical commitments.

Truth by Convention

As Quine himself summarizes them, the key conclusions of section I of his early paper "Truth by Convention" are that "definitions are available only for transforming truths, not for founding them," and hence that "if we are to construe logic as true by convention, we must rest logic ultimately upon some manner of convention other than definition" (Quine 1936, p. 88). In section II, Quine develops a minimalist account of a second sort of convention, "generating truths rather than merely transforming them" (Quine 1936, p. 88). According to Quine's account of this second sort of truth by convention, sentences can be made "true by fiat, by linguistic convention" (Quine 1936, p. 90).

Becker thinks Quine's explanation of truth by convention in section II of "Truth by Convention" is relatively unproblematic. "Section II," he writes, "is not as difficult as section I or section III; most readers should be able to follow it without assistance" (Becker, p. 28). This judgment is not unusual among Quine interpreters, but it leaves us without answers to a number of difficult questions about Quine's account of truth by convention in Section II, including: Does Quine's account imply (as Boghossian 1996 assumes) that we can "make it the case" by linguistic fiat that a proposition is true? If not (as I believe), then why does Quine speak of truth by convention here? Does he take himself to be investigating the consequences of Carnap's view of logic? Did Carnap believe that logic is true by convention? Becker bypasses such questions. Like several other interpreters (including Isaacson 1992), Becker thinks that there is little point in carefully examining the account of truth by convention that Quine offers in section II, since Quine disavows it, anyway, once it has served its dialectical purpose (Becker, p. 30).

There is reason to believe, however, that Quine never gave up the view that some sentences (though not all of logic) can be true by convention in the sense he explains in section II of "Truth by Convention." In Quine 1986, for instance, he writes, "However inadequate as a first cause of logical truth, stipulation in the usual sense is unproblematic as a source of truth" (Quine 1986, p. 206). I believe that to understand this puzzling remark, and, more generally, Quine's interest in truth by convention, one must see them in the context of his early acceptance of Carnap's views, including his revolutionary proposal that we reject traditional epistemology and replace it with what Carnap called the logic of science. (See Ebbs 2011a and Ebbs Forthcoming.) If we overlook Quine's intellectual debts to Carnap, we will fail to see how important it was to Quine to develop a naturalistic account of truth by convention.


In chapter 2, Becker presents the main arguments of Quine's celebrated paper, "Two Dogmas of Empiricism." Unlike some commentators (for instance, Hylton 1982 and Hookway 1988), Becker resists the temptation to simplify his exposition by taking section 5 to present Quine's main argument against analyticity. In section 5 Quine argues from holism in theory testing to the conclusion that one cannot define analyticity in terms of confirmation and disconfirmation of statements. The argument has prompted some commentators (including Grice and Strawson 1956) to complain that holism of theory testing is compatible with analyticity. This complaint misses Quine's point, which is that the holism undermines any effort to define analyticity solely in terms of confirmation and disconfirmation of statements. Becker correctly reads the argument of section 5 as presupposing the conclusions of the earlier sections, which aim to discredit attempts to define analyticity in other ways, and thereby to prepare the ground for section 5. And Becker's interpretation (Becker, p. 92) of the reasoning in the second paragraph of section 6 of "Two Dogmas" does not make the mistake of some recent writers, for instance, Chalmers 2011, who try to find in that paragraph a separate-standing argument against analyticity, when in fact it just spells out an immediate consequence of the sort of empiricism-without-dogmas that Quine sketches in the first paragraph of section 6.

Still, there are some odd mistakes and oversights. For instance, in what I suppose must be a copy-editing oversight, Becker attributes Carnap's essay, "Meaning and Synonymy in Natural Languages," to Quine (Becker, p. 73). More importantly, Becker's discussion of the argument of section 3, concerning the strategy of defining the synonymy of two expressions in terms of their intersubstitutivity salve veritate, fails to mention a crucial bit of the historical context. He writes, "to determine whether a sentence beginning with 'necessarily' is true, we have to determine whether the sentence following 'necessarily' is analytic, and we can do this only if we already understand 'analytic' " (Becker, p. 79). While this claim was plausible when Quine wrote "Two Dogmas" -- the best accounts of necessity at the time, due to Carnap, were given in terms of analyticity -- it can no longer be taken for granted, and even sympathetic readers may wonder why Quine reasonably regarded it as true.

At the end of chapter 2, Becker helpfully highlights Quine's remark that "the philosophically important question about analyticity and the linguistic doctrine of logical truth is not how to explicate them; it is the question rather of their relevance to epistemology" (Quine 1986, p. 207; cited in Becker, p. 120). To understand this remark, it is crucial to read it in the context of Quine's scientific naturalism, according to which (a) it is epistemically reasonable to accept a statement only insofar as one takes it to contribute to the "likeliest explanation" of topics that it concerns, and (b) the only legitimate criterion for the likeliest explanation is "scientific method itself, unsupported by ulterior controls" (Quine 1960, p. 23). From this naturalistic point of view any "relevance to epistemology" that the claim that a sentence is analytic may have derives from the explanatory contribution, if any, that the claim makes to one's current best scientific theory.

This is the criterion that Quine would use to evaluate the account of analyticity that Becker offers in the last section of his book, where he aims to "vindicate the idea that some sentences are analytic in an epistemically relevant way". (Becker, pp. 290-291) Becker's key idea is that a sentence Φ is analytic -- true in virtue of the meanings of its words -- if Φ is true is logically implied by an empirically adequate Davidsonian theory of meaning for L. (Becker argues in earlier sections of his last chapter that there is no significant indeterminacy of interpretation, so for any given natural language L there is only one empirically adequate theory of meaning for L. I do not have the space to discuss his arguments for this conclusion here.) If L is English, for instance, and to simplify our exposition we disregard sentences containing indexicals and demonstratives, such a theory will entail biconditionals of the form

(T) Φ is true in English if and only if Φ.

Becker reasons as follows. Suppose Φ is a truth-functionally (and hence logically) true sentence of English, such as 'If rabbits hop, then rabbits hop'. Then since Φ is a sentence of English, a Davidsonian theory of meaning for English will entail a corresponding instance of (T), namely

(1) 'If rabbits hop, then rabbits hop' is true in English if and only if if rabbits hop, then rabbits hop.

The right-hand side of (1) is a truth-functional logical truth, namely

(2) If rabbits hop, then rabbits hop.

Hence (1) truth-functionally implies its left-hand side, namely,

(3) 'If rabbits hop, then rabbits hop' is true in English.

In short, since the right-hand side of (1), namely (2), is a truth-functional logical truth, and (1) is a material biconditional, (1) truth-functionally implies (3). Becker concludes that 'If rabbits hop, then rabbits hop' is analytic -- true in virtue of the meanings of its words (Becker, p. 290, with 'snow is white' changed to 'rabbits hop'). More generally, every biconditional obtained by substituting a truth-functionally (and hence logically) true sentence of English for Φ in (T) truth-functionally implies the sentence on its left-hand side. This shows, according to Becker, that "The truth-functional truths are analytic -- true by virtue of the meanings of their words -- in the sense that their truth follows from a theory of meaning that shows how the meanings of sentences depends upon the meanings of their words. . . . they follow logically from a theory that makes no appeal to extra-linguistic facts" (Becker, p. 291). (Becker also extends the account to cover quantificational logical truths and definitional truths (Becker, pp. 292-296). I shall not discuss these extensions here.)

The main problem with this account is that the fact that (1) truth-functionally implies (3) does not establish that 'If rabbits hop, then rabbits hop' is analytic in an epistemically relevant sense, since it does not establish that truth-functional logic itself, in terms of which truth-functional implication is defined, is analytic, or makes no appeal to any extra-linguistic facts, in any epistemically relevant sense. To see the problem, suppose Φ is the English sentence 'Rabbits hop', a non-logical truth that a typical English speaker will readily affirm. A Davidsonian theory of meaning for English will entail

(4) 'Rabbits hop' is true in English if and only if rabbits hop.

In addition, as just noted, a typical English speaker will readily affirm

(5) Rabbits hop.

But (4) and (5) together truth-functionally imply the left-hand side of (4), namely

(6) 'Rabbits hop' is true in English.

A person who wishes to answer Quine's criticisms of the notion of analyticity would not want to conclude from this derivation of (6) that 'Rabbits hop' is analytic. The problem for Becker's theory, however, is that the only significant difference between the two truth-functional implications (from (1) to (3) and (4) and (5) to (6)) is that the former implication relies solely on truth-functional logic, and the latter relies on truth-functional logic together with an additional obvious truth, namely (5). This difference does not explain why 'If rabbits hop, then rabbits hop' is analytic and 'Rabbits hop' is not analytic unless it is supplemented by an explanation of why the truth-functional implications (from (1) to (3) and (4) and (5) to (6)) and their corresponding logical truths (which we may abbreviate as 'If (1) then (3)' and 'If (4) and (5), then (6)') are themselves analytic (or make no appeal to any extra-linguistic facts), whereas many obvious non-logical truths, such as (5), are not analytic.

To understand this problem, it is crucial to keep two key points in mind.

(i) Quine rejects all supposedly epistemically relevant notions of analyticity across the board, even when they are applied to elementary logical truths. (See, for instance, Quine 1953, Quine 1960, p. 65 fn3, and Quine 1963, p. 387.)

(ii) The whole point of the notion of analyticity (and the associated linguistic doctrine of logical truth) for the positivists, especially Carnap (see Carnap 1963, p. 64), as well as the source of its prima facie appeal for Quine (see Quine 1963, p. 386), is that it is supposed to enable us to explain how it can be reasonable for us to accept some truths without any empirical evidence even if we reject the traditional rationalists' assumption that we can come to know those truths a priori, by reasoning alone.

If one hopes to provide a convincing naturalistic response to Quine, as Becker does (Becker, p. 292), then point (i) implies that one cannot presuppose that elementary logic is itself analytic, and hence makes no appeal to non-linguistic facts, in an epistemically relevant sense, and point (ii) implies that one cannot presuppose rationalism, according to which the difference between the implications (from (1) to (3) and (4) and (5) to (6)) is that the first one relies on facts that can be known a priori, by reasoning alone, and the second one does not.

Becker does not mention points (i) and (ii) and does not explain how the truth-functional logical truths are analytic in an epistemically relevant sense, in contrast with such obvious truths as (5). The closest he comes to considering the need for such an explanation is on page 292, where he notes that if his account were designed to justify the logical truths, it would be "doomed to failure" by the sort of regress problem that Quine describes in "Truth by Convention." He thinks his account is not vulnerable to this problem, since it does not aim to justify the logical truths. The primary problem with his account, however, is not that it fails to justify truth-functional logical truths, but that it does not explain what distinguishes them from such widely-accepted truths as (5), which no defender of analyticity would classify as analytic. A fortiori, the account does not explain what it is for a sentence such as 'If rabbits hop then rabbits hop' to be analytic in an epistemically relevant sense.

Ontological Relativity and Inscrutability of Reference

A proper understanding of the relationship between language use, on the one hand, and ascriptions of reference to particular words, on the other, is critical to a proper understanding of Quine's puzzling accounts of ontological relativity and inscrutability of reference. In his chapter on these topics, Becker tackles the vexed question of whether, and, if so, how Quine can avoid the paradoxical conclusion that reference is "nonsense not just in radical translation but at home" (Quine 1969, p. 48). A key step in Quine's elusive response to this apparent paradox is to observe that "in practice we end the regress of background languages, in discussions of reference, by acquiescing in our mother tongue and taking its words at face value" (Quine 1969, p. 49).

On Becker's interpretation, to take one's words "at face value," as Quine uses this phrase in the passage just quoted, is to accept a disquotational account of reference for them. He writes,

when we are using a network of terms, predicates, and auxiliaries to talk meaningfully and distinctively of rabbits, rabbit parts, etc., we do not question the meanings or references of its expressions; we take them at face value. We assume that our word 'rabbit' refers to rabbits, that our expression 'rabbit part' refers to rabbit parts, etc. (Becker, p. 213)

Becker may have been led to this interpretation by the tempting thought that "value" should be read as "semantic value," so that to take one's words at their "face value" is to take them at their "face semantic value," where one's words' face semantic values are specified by Tarski-style disquotational satisfaction clauses for them. The thought is that such "face semantic values" are built into our understanding of our words whenever we use them to make claims.

If we each always take our own words at face semantic value in this sense when we use them, however, it is difficult to understand Quine's claim that "we can reproduce the inscrutability of reference at home" (Quine 1969, p. 47), for this claim appears to imply that we can make sense of using our words, thereby taking them at face value, while simultaneously accepting alternative, non-disquotational satisfaction clauses for them. Becker's response to this difficulty is to argue that contrary to appearances, Quine is committed to rejecting the claim that we can each view our own linguistic behavior in a way that allows us simultaneously to use our own words and to accept alternative, non-disquotational satisfaction clauses for them. He reasons as follows:

Where we are "at home in our language," we take the references of our terms at face value and thus take them as being scrutable. It would seem that, in order to see that the inscrutability applies to ourselves, we would have to achieve a God-like perspective that was independent of any language or theory. It does not seem to make sense to suppose that we could achieve such a perspective, and Quine has repeatedly stressed that we must speak from the perspective of some theory or other. (Becker, p. 215)

To question the references of our own words, however, it is enough to adopt the sort of perspective on our own linguistic behavior that we mortals can have on other speakers' linguistic behavior when we apply Quine's theory of translation to it. There is no serious barrier to adopting this sort of perspective on our own linguistic behavior. We can look at ourselves in a mirror, for instance, or ask someone else to observe us and provide us with a record of what she observes. In short, we can study our linguistic behavior as if it were someone else's, and translate our language into itself in ways that illustrate the inscrutability of reference. Granted, not all of the semantic vocabulary of a language L, including our own, can be translated into L, if L is consistent. We can nevertheless coherently translate our word 'rabbit' by our phrase 'undetached rabbit part', if we also make appropriate compensatory adjustments in translations of other words. Contrary to Becker's argument, there is no barrier to mapping our own words into themselves in a way that illustrates Quine's thesis of the inscrutability of reference.

These observations do not fit well with Becker's assumption that to use one's own words, one must take them at face semantic value, in the sense explained above. In my view, however, Becker's interpretation of Quine's phrase "face value", while tempting, is mistaken. To take one's words at face value, for Quine, is simply to use the words. The key point, as I explained it in a recent paper, is that "Insofar as we are using, and not also mentioning, a given string of non-semantic words, no particular relation between those words and things is asserted, presupposed, or implied" (Ebbs 2011b, p. 626). We can take our words at face value in this non-semantic sense while simultaneously affirming a non-disquotational account of reference for them. A similarly non-semantic understanding of language use can be found already in Carnap 1937, in which Carnap takes for granted that we can make sense of and use what he called "object-sentences," such as "Rabbits are mammals," even if we eschew any theorizing about reference and truth (Carnap 1937, pp. 285-286). Here then is another place where Becker's understanding of Quine could have benefitted from a more detailed examination of the relationship between Quine's and Carnap's views.

I have raised three main problems -- the first about Becker's interpretation of Quine's view of truth by convention, the second about Becker's attempt to explain analyticity, and the third about his argument that we cannot occupy a point of view from which we describe the references of our own words as inscrutable. In each case I have suggested that Becker misses something important about the issues under discussion partly as a result of his interpretive strategy of viewing each of Quine's central writings as largely self-contained, without looking for interpretive clues in Quine's letters and unpublished lectures, or trying to interpret Quine's writings in light of evidence of his intellectual debts to Rudolf Carnap. Despite these problems, I think there is much to admire in Becker's book, especially its patient, detailed scrutiny of some of Quine's central writings and its aim of challenging Quine's arguments on their own terms. Anyone with a serious interest in understanding Quine should read it.


Thanks to Kate Abramson, Matt Carlson, Kirk Ludwig, and Joan Weiner for helpful comments on previous drafts.


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