The Theological Origins of Modernity

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Michael Allen Gillespie, The Theological Origins of Modernity, University of Chicago Press, 2008, 386pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226293455.
University of Notre Dame / Uganda Martyrs University, Nkozi

Reviewed by David Burrell, C.S.C., University of Notre Dame/Uganda Martyrs University, Nkozi


This massively erudite study offers an alterative genealogy of "modernity," showing it to be a sustained attempt to re-cast the created world in a new key, once the metaphysical idiom had shifted from "scholasticism" to "nominalism." Gillespie challenges the standard account, which focuses on the religious wars of the seventeenth century to trigger a set of strategies we call "modern," inaugurated as ploys to circumvent and neutralize "religion" or "faith," so as to clear a way to understand the universe more straightforwardly. His elaborately constructed case proposes to show how intractable controversies in philosophical theology helped to shape the goals of that more straightforward understanding of nature, though not the disparate paths proposed to attain that understanding. The details of the case instruct us well in the "history of ideas," allowing us to become philosophically engaged as dialectical oppositions emerge and meet. His story opens in Avignon with a brief chance encounter of William of Ockham, Francesco Petrarch, and Meister Eckhart after Sunday mass (1, 43). In different ways, these three presage the emergence of alternatives to "scholastic realism," each shaped by the novel metaphysical mode of "nominalism." But let us outline the story before scrutinizing what these abstract names portend for the author, and the ways he wishes to put them into play.

The initial chapter elaborates the metaphysical thesis noted, rooting the dynamic proper to modernity in the near-total supersession of "nominalism" over "scholasticism," with the narrative then moving to "Petrarch and the invention of individuality," leading into a fulsome description of Italian humanism by way of its principal protagonists, only to shift to the Low Countries with the impressive figure of Erasmus. While frequently mentioned as a source of patronage for intellectuals, the papal court provides the cultural backdrop for the urbane Christian humanism of the Mediterranean, yet that very urbanity proved a stumbling block to the church's claim to presage the coming of the Kingdom, triggering a northern reaction of righteous reform: "Luther and the storm of faith." The ensuing chapter proves axial to the author's thesis: Erasmus and Luther locked in combat yet each somehow beholden to the "nominalist" revolution. The next two chapters focus on Descartes and Hobbes, respectively, each searching for new strategies with which to think the universe, while these are tested in a mutual encounter highlighted in the final chapter: "contradictions of the enlightenment." An epilogue liberates us from the dreary landscape of northern Europe to introduce a player ancient and new: Islam; suggesting that "the west" will prove unable to engage Islam fruitfully until we understand the real roots of our touted modernity. So what appears as an afterthought in response to recent events, traumatic for the west, becomes the point of this extensive and intensive study. The detail of the extensive study is breathtaking, with intellectual biographies of the major protagonists elaborated against the backdrop of social and political upheavals of their times. We are constantly and consistently instructed. The intensive study, however, is bedeviled with some crucial ambiguities, though these need not undermine the author's overall thesis, and may in fact elicit refinements which could prove enlightening.

Philosophers will always quibble with historians of ideas, yet whoever identifies with one of these self-descriptions will inevitably poach on the other, so the philosopher in me will often find their narratives philosophically illuminating. That said, my quibble lies with the central thesis: what does the author mean by "nominalism"? As the thesis develops, it is variously described as "the nominalist ontology of radical individualism" (261), more specifically as "the recognition that the three traditional realms of metaphysica specialis, God, man, and nature, were ontologically the same, though they remained ontically separate from one another" (282), which should prepare us for his central contention that

what actually occurs in the course of modernity is thus not simply the erasure or disappearance of God but the transference of his attributes, essential powers and capacities to other entities or realms of being. (274)

Now such a "transference" would be impossible unless the entities or "realms of being" in question were on a par. So these cumulative descriptors can begin to coalesce into an idea of what "nominalism" might come to, but a medieval philosopher could not but find Gillespie's description of the crucial contrast term, the "world which nominalism turned on its head," to be flat-footed:

Scholastics in the High Middle Ages were ontologically realist, that is to say, they believed in the real existence of universals, or to put the matter in another way, they experienced the world as the instantiation of the categories of divine reason. They experienced, believed in, and asserted the ultimate reality not of particular things but of universals, and they articulated this experience in a syllogistic logic that was perceived to correspond to or reflect divine reason. (14)

Whom is Gillespie describing here? A few Latin Averroists, perhaps? Certainly not Thomas Aquinas, who has long been accepted as paradigmatic of the group named. Furthermore, the use of "divine reason" would be troublesome to most medievals, for whom reason pertains properly to human beings; intelligence to the divine as well as to angelic beings. Moreover, to describe "scholastics" as endorsing such a garden variety "Platonism" would belie their major intent: to bring Aristotle's philosophy into the service of faith. Finally, what is lethal for Gillespie's thesis about this caricature of "scholastic realism" is that it serves to introduce the key contrast term which will structure his analysis of modernity: "nominalism." Nor do things improve much when he goes on to apply his mis-description dynamically:

Creation itself was the embodiment of this reason, and man, as the rational animal and imago dei, stood at the pinnacle of this creation, guided by a natural telos and a divinely revealed supernatural goal. (14)

For medievals, interestingly enough, it is not human beings but angels who crown this creation, thereby giving human beings a properly subordinate place; it is "humanism" which removed angels (in a spirit of parsimony) to elevate humans to the top, presaging the "ecological crisis," as we sought to make over the world to serve our needs.

But how can these observations be more than scholarly quibbles? A more severe mis-description will show how these contrast terms mutually implicate one another, compounding the confusion:

Scholastic metaphysics understood God as the highest being and creation as a rational order of beings stretching up to God. From the nominalist perspective, however, such an order is untenable not only because each being is radically individual but also and perhaps more importantly because God himself is not a being in the same sense as all created beings. (35)

Ironically, on this description Thomas Aquinas becomes a nominalist! The "scholastic metaphysics" in question might conform to some neo-Thomist manuals of the sort anathematized by Karl Barth and deplored by genuine students of Aquinas. Yet the author's use of "nominalism" turns essentially on contrasting it with this caricature. Here one might usefully contrast his treatment with that of Charles Taylor in his recent A Secular Age, or with John Milbank's characteristic way of decrying Scotus' malevolent influence, which this treatment superficially resembles; or even compare it with Josef Ratzinger at Regensburg, identifying authentic Christian tradition with using human intelligence to discern traces of the creator's activity. Let me suggest, finally, Gillespie's inability to distinguish 'reason' from 'intelligence' not only weakens his presentation of medieval reflection on divinity, but itself betrays a characteristically "modern" mindset; again, placing human beings as the apex of creation.

Yet we can also note that Gillespie's characteristic use of "nominalism" signals a telling shift, as he recalls (in relation to Martin Luther), "the extreme voluntarism that played such an important role in shaping the nominalist movement" (158). In fact, it may have been more illuminating to contrast "intellectualist" with "voluntarist," to recall the way "intellectualists" see God's goodness manifesting itself in orders of created beings, and so naturally leading to a language which celebrates analogy. That would have called attention to the predilection for univocity which has come to characterize modernity, whether in ordinary discourse or in scriptural interpretation, and so give a bit of attention to the salient features of "nominalism." But the feature on which Gillespie fastens can prove telling in tracing the way from medieval to modern sensibility, aided and abetted by the Black Death and the ensuing religious wars: "a concept of the individual what laid great emphasis on the power of the will" -- here attributed to Petrarch (77), along with "the arbitrariness and unpredictability of God's absolute power" (131), left starkly intrusive without "orders of being" to mediate. As he puts it, it was "the omnipotent and transrational God of nominalism … that so terrified the young Luther" (114). Yet strangely enough, Gillespie himself seems to fall into the trap he has so eloquently depicted, returning to "scholasticism" in the key chapter limning "the contradictions of modernity" to delineate how "both humanist and Reformation thought developed as responses to nominalism" (132).

Yet "their differences in these matters," he contends, "are a reflection of a deep tension within Christianity itself" (132). After a brief overview of the development of the Christian doctrines of incarnation and trinity, which limps as any brief overview must, he applauds the way "medieval scholastics and their predecessors explored the rationality of analogical reasoning with subtlety and insight" (133), only to trace that inquiry, once again, to their conviction that "the meaning of words was rooted in the real existence of universals" (133)! That howler aside, however, he finds that the adroit capacity to use human intelligence to think together the divine and human realms -- albeit analogically -- will turn out to be insufficient. Yet the reasons the author gives for that judgment -- and it is unclear whether he endorses them -- fashion a telling set of presumptions about divinity:

For all its obvious advantages, this scholastic view of the supremacy of reason seemed to many to call into question God's divinity, since it subordinated divine power to reason. [In fact,] this Aristotelian scholasticism was condemned in 1277 and attacked by Scotus, Ockham, and the nominalists in the years thereafter. They all rejected the supremacy of reason in God (and man) in favor of will. God could only be God if he were truly omnipotent. The essence of omnipotence in their view, however, was an absolute freedom that was indifferent to its object. God wills what he wills and wills it only because he wills it. While this position saved and affirmed God's divinity, … it brought Christians face to face with the central question that had plagued Christianity from the beginning. (134)

The "central question" plaguing Christianity is never adequately identified, though divinity is clearly identified with power. Moreover, once again, 'reason' is invoked where scholastics would rather attribute 'intelligence' or 'wisdom' to God, to insist that, although discourse about divinity may often run contrary to reason, it cannot offend our intelligence. More tellingly, however, it is difficult to see how identifying God with power "saves and affirms God's divinity," unless the god in question be a thoroughly pagan one. So if the author's story went off its philosophical rails in identifying scholasticism tout court with "the real existence of universals," it loses its theological bearings in identifying God with power.

Yet again, the genealogy is illuminating, as are the details instructive, and the thesis remains intact. However manifold and conflicting the intentions of humanists, modernity has turned out to busy itself with unresolved theological conundra. The same is abundantly clear of postmodernity, of course, yet Gillespie's arresting thesis certainly instructs us about dimensions of modernity which have been effectively obscured by a rhetoric claiming liberation from all that. If a jejune contrast between 'scholastic' and 'nominalist' cannot do the work the author intends it to do, he has nonetheless illustrated how pervasively theological are the travails of modernity. I have suggested how a comparison with the cognate efforts of Charles Taylor or of John Milbank might help clarify this central thesis. While Taylor's A Secular Age postdates this work, the absence of any reference to John Milbank's Theology and Social Theory (1992) is startling. While himself a philosopher, Charles Taylor assiduously avoids attributing the seismic shift to 'modernity' (or its clone, 'secularity') to a single factor like 'nominalism', however one may attempt to characterize it. He cites many of the contributing factors which Gillespie describes so well in his extensive narrative -- the Black Death, religious wars, ecclesiastical corruption -- weaving them together without a single determining factor, to depict the rise of a new imaginary, one in which human beings can subsist, converse, and act constructively without any ostensible reference to origins or purpose. Moreover, Taylor shows himself to be aware of John Milbank's more focused account, even noting how he could find it persuasive, yet prefers a more dialectical and genealogical account. Encapsulating Milbank's contention as the Intellectual Deviation story, and noting its parallel with Remi Brague's Wisdom of the World (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2003), Taylor summarizes it succinctly:

from the mechanization of the world picture, and the atrophy of a sense of God as connected to a meaningful cosmos, the sense falls away of a hierarchy of being, and we lose the context for a philosophy of analogy, and hence for a certain understanding of our (limited) access to a knowledge of God. Indeed, we might following John Milbank see this new "univocal" understanding of being, predicated alike of God and creatures, as the crucial shift from which other things flow. (774)

Yet while acknowledging that "this story explicates some very important truths and draws some crucial connections," Taylor demurs: "I don't think this can suffice as the main story behind secularity" (774). He draws his explanatory circle much wider, to include many of the factors which Gillespie elaborates, calling his historical-cultural story "the Reform Master Narrative." Now it will be unsurprising that Gillespie's extended narrative of the "theological origins of modernity" should dovetail with Taylor's anatomy of "the secular," yet Taylor is more intent on showing secularity to arise from a congeries of factors resulting in a novel imaginary, rather than tracing the phenomenon to one axial movement or mindset, like "nominalism." So let me conclude that the rich historical genealogy we have been following loses much of its richness by the author's attempt to trace its exuberance to an ill-defined singularity like "nominalism," as crucial as that sea-change has been.

Now to the epilogue, with the earmarks of an afterthought in response to recent events traumatic for the west, yet which in fact functions as the point of this study by reminding us how Islam, the antithesis of medieval Christendom, has become ours as well. Yet we will condemn ourselves to stand in irremediable opposition to this "other," never to understand it in a way revelatory of ourselves, unless and until we see the theological valence of the very modernity which we so neatly oppose to what we see Islam to be. Canards like "Islam has never known the enlightenment" are a stock part of our rhetorical quiver. Yet the concerns parents have when it comes to rearing children in a thoroughly permissive environment, as well as the query of political theorists whether "liberal society" can even be called a "society" at all, all bespeak a malaise regarding the fruits of "modernity" as it has become embodied in western social (dis)order. Those of us who can conceive of nothing else are horrified at various "fundamentalist" alternatives -- whether Jewish, Christian, or Muslim -- and are often inclined to accept the caricature which these "fundamentalist" wings present as Judaism, Christianity, or Islam itself. Yet that is exactly the uninstructed cul-de-sac which Gillespie decries, and which this monumental study intends to undermine.

He suspects, moreover, that an authentic encounter with Islam might even provoke a fresh understanding of ourselves, along the lines he has limned here:

the ways in which we in the Western world misunderstand Islam are complicated by the ways in which we misunderstand ourselves. This is especially true of our ignorance of the theological provenance of our own liberalism… . But perhaps such a misunderstanding is inevitable [when] modernity is above all convinced that it owes nothing to the past, that it has made itself, that what matters is what is happening right now. Indeed, this is the meaning of the freedom, power, and progress that we all prize. This belief, however, leaves us in a precarious situation. [For] if we do not understand the way in which our Christian past underlies the individualism and humanism at the heart of liberalism, we do not understand why radical Islam sees our liberal world as impious and immoral. We similarly do not understand the ways in which our liberal institutions are ill-suited to the Islamic view of the proper order of the world. (293)

I could not be more in agreement, and was in fact astounded with the tack suggested by the final five pages of this prolonged study. Yet just as a rich Christian tradition is falsified by reducing its God to power, capsule descriptions taken from its theological schools will hardly convey a rich Islamic heritage and culture. So this student of Islamic philosophical theology cannot help but challenge some of the standard depictions of that tradition presented here. Yet again, these quibbles cannot gainsay Gillespie's fundamental point: Islam presents us with a sterling opportunity to understand ourselves in ways which we have virtually ignored until quite recently.

The infelicitous generalizations happen to turn on areas where I have been able to show how much Jews and Christians profited from Islamic reflections, like free creation. So Gillespie's contention that "in contrast to Christianity, Islam rested not on the ontological connection of God and man but on their absolute difference and thus on the necessity of the submission of finite men to an infinite God" (290), can hardly be valid when we are constantly speaking of creatures of a creator -- no more palpable "ontological connection" than that! Moreover, his reflections on the theological schools -- Mu'tazlilite and Ash'arite -- are similarly garbled, notably as they repeat common western misperceptions. So we all need to learn better to appreciate the inner dynamic of Islamic philosophical theology, even if a brief epilogue will not be the place to carry that out. So let me close this critical appreciation with applause that a study so challenging ends with yet a further challenge -- to readers and to author alike.