The Theoretical Practices of Physics: Philosophical Essays

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R.I.G Hughes, The Theoretical Practices of Physics: Philosophical Essays, Oxford University Press, 2010, 278 pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199546107.

Reviewed by Mauricio Suárez, Complutense University of Madrid


This delightful book inaugurates a new style in philosophy of physics, and in philosophy of science more generally: a sort of "postmodern analytical philosophy of physics". The book collects revised versions of some of R.I.G. Hughes' already published essays together with some new essays. It focuses on the representational practices of theoretical physicists, particularly those that involve using theories in order to build representational models of diverse physical phenomena. The eight chapters in the book then deal with this theme in relation to a number of different case studies. Hughes has an unparalleled ability to draw meaningful connections between important issues in the philosophy of physics and more general issues in the arts and sciences at large, well beyond the confines of academic philosophy. He does this with both panache and analytical rigor. The ensuing diversity of aims, approaches, and detailed case studies is the most striking hallmark of the book, making it a very unusual and charismatic contribution to contemporary philosophy of physics.

The first chapter is an introduction to the wider philosophical context and broaches the first case study, Einstein's 1915 paper adumbrating the birth of the General Theory of Relativity. Hughes chooses this case study at this stage for well known and judiciously chosen historical reasons. One of Hughes' main foils throughout the book is a thesis that he ascribes to the logical empiricists, in particular to Rudolf Carnap. Carnap's thesis in this context is a view regarding the nature of physical theory, which has implications towards its representational import. It states that "any physical theory and, likewise, the whole of physics, can in this way be presented in the form of an interpreted system, consisting of a specific calculus (axiom system) and a system of semantic rules for its interpretation" (p. 14, quoting Carnap). This is essentially a statement of the so-called "received view" about scientific theories and can be contrasted with Hughes' preferred view, on which theories are rather sets of models together with a "theoretical hypothesis" linking those models to their applications. (These are often rather misleadingly referred to as the "syntactic" and the "semantic" views respectively. As a matter of fact Carnap's thesis entails that a theory is an axiom system endowed with a partial interpretation, therefore not at all devoid of semantics. Similarly, defenders of the 'semantic' view such as van Fraassen, Giere and Hughes himself have made it clear that theirs is more properly speaking a "non-linguistic" or "structuralist" view. The names "language-based" and "model-based" may more appropriately characterize the differences.)

The first chapter argues against Carnap's thesis by taking up precisely what prima facie is the hardest case of all, since it was a main inspiration in the logical empiricists' development of their own views. Einstein's General Theory of Relativity had a major impact upon Carnap, Reichenbach and Schlick, all of whom developed their philosophies of science in large measure as a reaction to it. By means of a careful analysis of the 1915 paper, Hughes convincingly argues that, far from providing a prime example of Carnap's thesis, the development and particularly the application of Einstein's theory rather supports the view that theorizing is a form of modeling -- involving the same idealized assumptions and presuppositions that characterize modeling in all areas of science.

We find a similar argumentative strategy at work in different parts of the book. (Another striking example is the comparison in chapter 4 of an array of disunities in physics with none other than Descartes' Discourse on Method!) It seems that whenever a position is argued for, the context, framework, and case studies chosen to illustrate it are among what prima facie would seem to be the most favorable grounds for the contrary view. There is a refreshing form of intellectual honesty or fair play at work here, which I find among Hughes' most endearing and convincing qualities. Most of us, given the option, would choose the most favorable case studies and would instinctively tend to frame our theses in their most favorable light. Hughes almost always chooses the hardest path, but there is wisdom to this strategy. First, it works rhetorically by raising the sympathies of that sort of reader -- like myself, I suspect, of a Feyerabendian bend -- likely to instinctively side with the underdog in any dispute. More to the point, the strategy works because a view's success in overcoming a challenge lends a degree of credibility to that view proportional to the size of the challenge. Thus the model-based view of theories gains new and unsuspected depth and credibility once we realize that the application of the General Theory of Relativity lines up nicely with it, and not -- as may have been anticipated - with Carnap's thesis.

Chapter 2 is devoted to a very different case study, what Hughes calls the Bohm-Pines quartet, a series of four papers by David Bohm (of Bohmian mechanics-fame) and his then PhD student at Princeton, David Pines, on modeling the behavior of electronic gases in metals as plasmas. What is remarkable about this chapter is its philosophical methodology. It engages in the kind of close reading and analysis of texts that is more characteristic of philosophical work in non-analytical traditions, particularly in comparative literature. The aim is to gain an understanding of the nature and structure of theoretical practice. The methodology is appropriate because theorizing, as opposed to, say, experimenting or instrument building, is mainly done through the publication of papers. At this point an objection may be raised. Hughes presents himself as a defender of a model-based view of theories, but as a matter of fact his is strictly a view about the activity of theorizing. It would have been good to have stated this explicitly, since the change of focus (from theories as entities to the activities involved in theorizing) is in line with recent interest abo ut the activities involved in representing as opposed to the relation of representation (for a summary see Suárez, 2010).

Chapter 3 addresses yet one more challenging case study, namely Newton's Principia. This is one of the most interesting chapters in the book, since the same comparative literature methodology in the analysis of the texts renders the rather amazing conclusion that Newton's theory of gravity does not support Carnap's thesis. Together with chapter one, this chapter constitutes the most striking illustration of the book's argumentative strategy. The discussion focuses on the notion of law and argues that Newton's three laws play not the role of axioms in a partly interpreted axiom system -- as Carnap's thesis would have us believe - but the role of principles in the building of models instead. First, Hughes carefully distinguishes the laws of physics from the notion of 'law of nature' that is often discussed in metaphysics. He rejects the latter notion on account of three well-known objections related to sources of the law's modal force, the distinction between genuine laws and mere accidental correlations, and the presence of ceteris paribus clauses. By contrast, he argues, the role ascribed to laws in a model-based account allow for articulate responses to such metaphysical challenges.

Chapter 4 is a sympathetic comment on the contemporary disunity movement. (The amusing fact that this movement has its origin in a paper published by Patrick Suppes in the 1970s is unfortunately not mentioned, nor is this classic paper included in the bibliography). It distinguishes five different kinds of disunities, or inconsistencies, in current physics theoretical practice, due to: i) changes in scale (nano, meso, macro, large scale structure of the universe); ii) different types of entities supposed in one and the very same model of a phenomenon (exemplified by the two fluid model of superconductivity); iii) semi-autonomous branches of physics (such as stellar astrophysics); iv) incompatible theoretical models of the same phenomenon (exemplified by the shell, liquid drop, optical and collective models of the atomic nucleus); and v) contradictory suppositions within a model (exemplified, according to Hughes, by Einstein's theoretical model of Brownian motion). The emphasis on disunities strengthens further the overall thesis of the book, since these forms of disunity are all compatible with the model-based account.

In chapter 5, the briefest in the book, Hughes sketches out his own view of representation, the so-called Denotation-Demonstration-Interpretation, or DDI account. This chapter is a slightly revised version of a paper delivered to the Philosophy of Science Association nearly 15 years ago (Hughes, 1997). At the time Hughes was actively engaged in the Models as Mediators research project at the London School of Economics (Morgan and Morrison, 1999). It seems to me that the engagement was mutually beneficial and planted the seeds for many of the essays that appear in this book. It may even be responsible for the shift in Hughes' interest towards the activity of theorizing. Hughes defends not quite a theory of representation, but some sort of vague conception, since he does not stipulate necessary and sufficient conditions for the relation of representation. Rather, he characterizes the activity of representing in science through a mixture of a relation and two separate activities. There is first the relation of denotation by which the model M links up to some phenomenon P in the world. Then there is the activity involved in demonstrating that some result obtains within the model; this is followed by the distinct activity of interpreting the model in terms of the phenomenon. We may then say that M represents P if i) M denotes P, ii) we may carry out some demonstration in M and iii) we may bring to bear the outcomes of the demonstration onto P by means of some interpretation of the main elements of M in terms of P.

In chapter 6, Hughes discusses his star example, the Ising model. This is a very abstract model; it really is just in fact a bare mathematical structure. More specifically, it is a set of points, or sites, in a geometrical space endowed with some probabilistic structure. The model is widely applied to a variety of critical phenomena above the critical temperature, such as paramagnetism, the coexistence of phases, or critical opalescence. Its most remarkable feature is its universality -- since it can be applied independently of the material composition, internal structure and size of the systems involved. This sort of scale invariance makes for a very useful set of mathematical techniques, applicable across the board. It is unclear, however, how much of a genuine representation it amounts to. There is a sense in which the model rather acts in the way that a law of physics in Hughes' account does, that is, as a main tool in developing more concrete representative models of the phenomena. A further issue emerges, however tangentially, in the discussion, namely a distinction between two different forms of computer use in science. On the one hand, Hughes argues that computers can be used simply to carry out calculations that would otherwise be analytically intractable. On the other hand, they can provide Monte Carlo simulations of physical processes. The DDI account nicely accommodates and explains the distinction, and this is certainly a good point in favor of non-mapping accounts of representation more generally.

Chapter 7 addresses theoretical explanation. In agreement with the general conception of theorizing defended in the book, Hughes' view is that "we explain some feature X of the world by displaying a theoretical model M of part of the world, and demonstrating that there is a feature Y of the model that corresponds to X, and is not explicit in the definition of M" (p. 210). In other words we explain by deriving some result out of the basic model assumptions, which we then show to have a correlate in the feature of the phenomenon we wish to explain. This account of explanation is defended by example; it is shown to agree with some elementary physics explanations of the rainbow, including Newton's one (on the supposition of a corpuscular theory of light) and more contemporary ones (on the supposition of the electromagnetic nature of light). The account has some nice features, particularly in comparison with the covering law account. For instance, it does not require that a law be included in the explanans; and even when it is, it may not be possible to deduce the explanandum. More generally, this is a simulacrum account of explanation, since the explanans is not required to be true, as illustrated by its application to Newton's explanation of the rainbow.

The only requirement imposed by Hughes on explanation is that the theories (or sets of models) invoked in the explanans be "acceptable". Yet his account of acceptability is also very minimal, since it takes any theory to be acceptable within a domain if it provides adequate representations of the phenomena in that domain. 'Adequacy' is taken here to mean both 'empirical' and 'explanatory' adequacy (see particularly p. 232, but also the discussion of representation in general on p. 160). So circularity looms, but at any rate the constraints on explanation are rather weak -- to the extent that, for Hughes, explanation and representation are normatively indistinguishable.

The last chapter of the book closes a circle, returning to the methodology of the close reading and analysis of scientific texts. It is a commentary on the paper where Yakir Aharonov and David Bohm first introduced the notorious effect that bears their name (the Aharonov-Bohm effect). Hughes analyses the paper at four different levels: structural, theoretical, rhetorical, and discursive. The last sort of analysis gives rise to some comments on what is referred to, in a rather Foucaultian spirit, as the 'discourse' of physics. On Hughes' account this is the kind of artificial hybrid dialect, or 'creole', employed in what Peter Galison (1997) has called the trading zone between theoreticians and experimentalists. What is remarkable about this dialect and enables the commensurability of the terms employed by both theoreticians and experimentalists is the appeal to some basic ontology. The logical empiricists distinguished the material and formal mode of speech and decried the former. But the hybrid language of the trading zone turns out to precisely employ the material mode. Hence incommensurability emerges as a byproduct of Carnap's thesis. And the model-based conception of theories can be seen to be opening the way for the trading zone between experimental and theoretical work that characterizes the discourse of physical science.

To sum up, The Theoretical Practices of Physics is a highly recommended book. It provides much detailed analysis of some interesting new case studies in theoretical physics and contains plenty of subtle distinctions, profound insights and fascinating quirky interpretations of both the practice of theoretical modeling and the history of philosophy of science. There are a few errata in the book (e.g., the wrong reference is given to Einstein's famous 1915 paper), but on the whole the editorial work is careful and there is some effort to cross-refer entries in very different fields. It is a highly original, beautifully creative book that brings the techniques of textual analysis typical of continental philosophy and comparative literature to bear on difficult issues in analytical philosophy of physics. It breaks new ground in philosophy of physics and deserves to be read by everyone with an interest in the field.


Galison, P. (1997), Image and Logic, University of Chicago Press.

Hughes, RIG (1997), "Models and Representation", Philosophy of Science, 64, pp. 325-336.

Morgan, M. and M. Morrison, Ed., (1999), Models as Mediators, Cambridge University Press.

Suárez, M. (2010), "Scientific Representation", Philosophy Compass, 5 (1), Blackwell, pp. 91-101.