The Theory and Practice of Life: Isocrates and the Philosophers

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Tarik Wareh, The Theory and Practice of Life: Isocrates and the Philosophers, Center for Hellenic Studies, 2012, 236pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780674067134.

Reviewed by Mike Edwards, University of Roehampton


In this excellent book, Tarik Wareh attempts a thorough reconsideration of the links between Isocrates and his school, and the schools of Plato, and, in particular, of Aristotle. In so doing he offers a challenging new version of the intellectual history of the fourth century, which deserves to be taken very seriously by scholars in the field. Wareh downplays the distinction that is regularly drawn between an Isocratean philosophia that barely merits the name, and the real philosophy of the Academy and the Lyceum, and instead emphasizes the "surprisingly close theoretical interconnections between rhetoric and philosophy" (p. 1). The work falls into two main parts, with a short Conclusion, followed by an extensive Bibliography, a helpful Index of Primary Sources, and a Subject Index.

In Part I ("Isocrates and Aristotle: An Entanglement"), Wareh advances the thesis that Isocrates' ideas were both a provocation and an inspiration to Aristotle in writing the Nicomachean Ethics and Plato in the Phaedrus. He treats the thinkers in that order in the first two chapters and somewhat unevenly: far more space is devoted to Aristotle, who is also the subject of chapter 3. His method is a close reading of the texts, drawing linguistic parallels as evidence of Isocrates' influence on Aristotle and Plato, and their theoretical affinities. In particular, in chapter 1 Wareh explores Isocratean protreptic connections ("entanglement") with Aristotle's Protrepticus. With typical subtlety, Wareh parallels Isocrates' comparison between those who cannot make proper use of the goods they possess with the owner of a fine horse lacking the knowledge of horsemanship at To Demonicus 27 and Aristotle's association in the Protrepticus of the worthless man abundantly furnished with goods and the horse with golden trappings, which disguise its poor nature (POxy 666, lines 92-100). With typical confidence he firmly states, "This association is confirmed as Aristotle goes on immediately to consider the man inferior to his own domestics . . . which more precisely matches the thought of the fine horse's ignorant owner in To Demonicus" (pp. 43-4). Scholars may find some of the parallels tenuous, but the overall effect is persuasive.

Wareh moves on in chapter 2 to explore the connections rather than differences between Isocratean rhetoric and the true rhetoric of Plato's Phaedrus, for Socrates' linking of philosophical rhetoric and Hippocratic medicine in the Phaedrus raises "the ultimate impossibility of a practical art that is completely rationally formulable" (p. 6). The tension between the rationalist medical principles that Socrates espouses and the reality of practical medicine points towards a dialogue that was taking place at the time, and, according to Wareh, in the development of "a flexible methodology capable of marrying experience and doctrine, it seems that rhetoric and medicine were unusually advanced and sophisticated examples" (p. 73). Plato's admission of the possibility of a proper art of rhetoric, one which "is philosophical and grounded in dialectical knowledge of the truth" (p. 58) on the analogy with Hippocratic medicine, links into Isocrates' attempt to reconcile the theory and practice of rhetoric, which for him too should be grounded on knowledge (Against the Sophists 16 is a key text here for Wareh). While most of the book focuses on Aristotle, this challenging chapter on Plato is not only thought-provoking, but whets the appetite for possible future explorations by Wareh of other Platonic dialogues. One paragraph particularly interested me as a rhetorician interested in the origins of rhetorical theory and the modern theories of scholars such as Thomas Cole and Edward Schiappa: in comparing for their terminology passages of Plato, Isocrates, and the Anonymus Iamblichi, Wareh notes that the last of these "pushes the pattern back into the fifth century, confirming that the Isocratean language that we can show was topical for Plato and Aristotle has its roots in the earlier rhetorical and tekhnē tradition" (p. 66).

In chapter 3, Wareh surveys the scant (and late) evidence for the exoteric Aristotle, focusing on the younger Aristotle's public lectures in rhetoric that were inspired by rivalry with Isocrates. While this activity was praised by Cicero, who was deeply interested in the links between philosophy and rhetoric, it naturally aroused the hostility of Philodemus (in Book 8 of his own Rhetorica) who consequently praised Isocrates for adherence to philosophy (for Wareh the person who "retired from rhetoric to philosophy" in PHerc 1015 col. LV is Isocrates, not Aristotle). The Epicurean only had time for epideictic rhetoric, which for him was exemplified by Isocrates. In his discussion of Aristotle's exoteric writings, Wareh considers his Collection of the Art of Theodectes, which leads into a survey of the complex evidence for crossover between the schools of Plato and Isocrates, and then the lectures of Aristotle, among figures such as Theodectes, the shady Isocrates of Apollonia (the "successor" of Isocrates, if he was the "Pontic student" derided by Plato's own successor, his nephew Speusippus), the even more obscure Helicon of Cyzicus (mentioned in the Platonic Epistle XIII), Clearchus, tyrant of Heraclea Pontica, and several others. The evidence is almost always controversial, and Wareh has sifted it minutely.

Wareh's discussion of these figures prepares the way for the second part of the book ("School Creatures: Literary Competition, Philosophy, and Politics"), an exciting and, for me, largely successful attempt to recover the intellectual activity of the students of Plato and Isocrates, "the 'school politics' of a poorly understood but vital transitional period in literary and intellectual history" (p. 115). The figure discussed in detail in chapter 4 is the anti-Platonic Theopompus -- his relationship with Philip of Macedon and his attacks on Theocritus of Chios and Hermias of Atarneus -- followed by a short section on Ephorus. Chapter 5 begins with prose obituary eulogies, emphasizing the seminal importance of Isocrates' Evagoras, but noting how the myriad encomia of Xenophon's son, who died at Mantinea, prompted Aristotle's first (probably anti-Isocratean) foray into rhetoric in his Gryllus and may have wearied Isocrates himself. Also noteworthy is the subsequent funeral contest over Mausolus in 352, which involved four Isocrateans (Theopompus, Theodectes, Isocrates of Apollonia, and Naucrates of Erythrae). Wareh follows his survey of funerary rhetoric with detailed discussion of Hermias and Theocritus, before turning to the genre of the wise man's counseling of a monarch, as exemplified by Isocrates' Philip. This in turn is juxtaposed with Speusippus' Letter to Philip and its withering attack on Isocrates and his school (Theopompus in particular). Wareh very helpfully includes a translation of the letter before chapter 5, but his extensive, detailed defense of the date and authorship of the text against Bertelli (which the translation facilitates) has the feel of an article and, as he admits (p. 178), delays discussion of the affiliations of the persons involved. That discussion is again excellent, however, drawing attention for example to the fact that Speusippus indicates Isocrates' Philip was read in the Academy -- "evidence for the interested rereading and misreading (or, more charitably, critical reading) of rival schools' texts within the walls of a school" (p. 188). Wareh also considers the influence of these works that has been detected on actual politics, reaching the conclusion that

It cannot be overemphasized how unsatisfactory it is to take the crass attacks and displays of interest that feature in this new "politics" as evidence for a sudden growth of the philosophers' interest in honest-to-goodness, down-and-dirty, nakedly political politics. (p. 194)

A salutary warning.

The book concludes with "Isocrateanism in the Renaissance". The discussion itself, which encompasses Erasmus, Machiavelli, and Castiglione, and then Queen Elizabeth I, is very interesting and maintains the high quality of the preceding work. But it is disappointingly brief (just over eleven pages), giving me the feel of an addendum rather than a conclusion to the book's thesis. Once more, I hope that Wareh in due course will develop his ideas here at far greater length, for in perceptively noting verbal reminiscences of Isocrates in Machiavelli and Castiglione he demonstrates that he has much to contribute to the field of Isocratean reception.

This book (at least, once more, for me) is not an easy read. There are intricate and detailed arguments on almost every page. While it does not assume close knowledge of Plato and Aristotle, and far less of the often obscure later sources, those who are relatively new to the subject area (such as the students of Early Modern literature who form part of Wareh's intended audience, (p. 9)) may find it hard going at times. I imagine also that non-Latinists may be puzzled by "the oft-repeated discunt, alter, uti dixit Isocrates in Ephoro et Theopompo, frenis eget, alter calcaribus" on p. 123, unless they can link the Latin there to "the ben trovato tradition that Isocrates thought [Theopompus] needed the reins while Ephorus required the goad" on p. 132. But this is very unusual, and while sentences are frequently punctuated by Greek (both in the original and transliterated) and Latin, the sources are regularly translated (I am not sure why Wareh gives Anthony Francis Natoli's translation of the Letter to Philip 11 on p. 147 when he has translated it himself on p. 138). Wareh indeed writes in an engaging, colloquial style (see the quote above from p. 194), and while the complexities of the book do not make it an easy task for the reviewer, they certainly reward the attention of the reader, sympathetic or otherwise.

Even from this briefest of summaries it is evident that this book's basic thesis is challenging and provocative, and in my view it is generally persuasive. Doubtless, however, it will not meet with universal approval being, I suspect, a more comfortable read for students of Isocrates and rhetoric than of Aristotle, Plato, and philosophy. Nevertheless, it certainly is meticulously researched and carefully argued. I thoroughly recommend it to scholars on both sides.