The Theory of Ontic Modalities

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Uwe Meixner, The Theory of Ontic Modalities, Ontos, 2006, 374pp., $99.95 (hbk), ISBN 3938793112.

Reviewed by Max A. Freund, Universidad Nacional de Costa Rica


This book covers many important topics in metaphysics, epistemology and logic. These include: being and existence, states of affairs, possible worlds, actualism, knowledge of possible and necessary truths, conditionals, de re and de dicto modalities, semantics of modal statements, propositions, properties, individual essences and logical necessity. Notwithstanding the diversity of themes treated, many of them are unified in the book by the author's main goal, which is to present a theory of intensional entities, more precisely, a mereological theory of states of affairs and properties, on which basis he will intend to solve certain philosophical problems regarding ontic modalities. Also, given the author's view of possible worlds as maximal-consistent states of affairs, his theory could be viewed as a sort of modal realism.

The book is organized as follows: the first two chapters are devoted to the exposition and discussion of three philosophical problems connected with alethic modalities and which he himself brands the "semantical", "ontological" and "epistemological" problems of ontic modality. In chapter 3, the author expounds a mereological theory of states of affairs. On this basis, he presents a solution to the first two problems. In chapter 4, he tries to answer questions his theory might raise and confronts it with views of other philosophers. In chapter 7, the mereological theory of chapter 3 is extended so as to include properties and individuals. Implications of this extension for de re necessity are considered in the following chapter. Chapters 5 and 6 are devoted to conditionals. Incidentally, in chapter 5, the author offers a solution to the epistemological problem of ontic modality.

We present now, in more detail, the main aspects of the above content. We start with the book's central theory, viz.: the mereology of states of affairs, that is, the theory of parts of states of affairs. This theoretical corpus is expressed in the book in the fashion of a first-order formal system (informally interpreted) and a proof of consistency for the system is provided relative to set-theory. The relationship of parthood the theory is supposed to capture is intensional and so it is different from the relation of parthood applicable to wholes of material individuals. By adding axioms and definitions regarding properties and individuals, the theory is later extended in the book to cover these entities. In this extension, the notion of intensional parthood is also applied to properties. Nevertheless, this application is assumed to be reducible to intensional parthood between states of affairs. It is important to remark that the entire theory contains principles providing identity conditions for both states of affairs and properties, but not for individuals.

Despite its formal presentation, we found two problems with the theory's exposition. The major problem concerns the grounds for accepting the theory itself. The author does not present acceptable motivations for several definitions and axioms of the mereological theory. He also does not discuss at all or give an ample explanation of two of the most important non-logical primitive concepts of the theory (viz., the relationship of intensional parthood and the dyadic functor the author calls "the saturator"). Incidentally, the author offers some scattered remarks on the relationship between logical necessity and intensional parthood (see pp. 68 and 195, for example), which might guide us a little bit in evaluating the theory if they were correct. However, since a philosophical explanation of intensional parthood is missing, it is not possible to assess those remarks and so, in practice, they are of little help. In sum, since the book does not provide a deep philosophical discussion of intensional parthood or acceptable motivations for several of its axioms and definitions, the reader is not able to judge the plausibility or merits of Meixner's mereological theory.

A minor problem concerns the order of the theory's exposition, which we consider not to be the most adequate. The author formulates several of the theory's axioms before defining certain non-logical expressions occurring in them. In other words, non-logical key terms in the axioms are definitionally introduced after the axioms themselves. This clearly does not help for an initial understanding of the formal system.

Given the mereological theory of states of affairs, the author applies it to the interpretation of alethic modal discourse, and in our opinion this could be an interesting original contribution on his part if an elucidation of the notion of intensional parthood were offered. The interpretation implies different sorts of conditionals, and operators of alethic necessity and possibility. This diversity is a consequence of Meixner's view that the content of the concepts of necessity and possibility depend on a basis consisting of a given state of affairs, which is why he calls his theory "a bases theory of ontological modality". Relative to certain states of affairs, one can obtain different notions of alethic necessity and possibility.

The author provides examples of states of affairs that could play the abovementioned role of bases. Among them, there is the state of affairs that is part of every state of affairs, the state of affairs that is the sum of all obtaining states of affairs, and the state of affairs which is the conjunction of all states of affairs that are laws of nature. These particular entities would yield, according to Meixner, alethic propositional operators of logical necessity, factuality and nomological necessity, respectively.

Now, as we have indicated, the author states three philosophical problems regarding alethic necessity, which he calls the "semantical", "ontological" and "epistemological" problems of ontic modality. A solution to these problems seems to be, if not the main, then at least one of the principal motivations for the theories developed in the book. The first problem is the question regarding the truth-conditions of sentences involving alethic modal operators of necessity and possibility, and conditionals.  The second asks for the items needed in our ontology to render those same sentences either true or false. It should be clear, given the above, that the author presents solutions to both of these problems by means of the mereological theory. The ontological items needed for the ontological problem, including states of affairs and the truth-conditions of the sentences in question, are provided by means of his interpretation of alethic modal discourse.

The question of how we know the truth or falsehood of modal statements with conditionals or modal alethic operators of necessity and possibility is the epistemological problem. Its solution by the author is preceded by a discussion of conditionals, a topic to which he devotes considerable space in his book. In general, he interprets conditionals as statements of relational necessity and proves them to be reducible to non-relational necessities on the pattern of strict implication. Via this proof, the author is able to justify one of his main theses regarding conditionals, viz.: utterance of any conditional should involve reference to some state of affairs constituting a basis for necessity. Without this basis, the conditional is neither true nor false. The author thinks that the bases to which conditionals refer are, in general, determined by the context of the conditionals' utterances. Furthermore, according to him, these bases should be obtaining states of affairs.

Meixner's answer to the epistemological problem results from generalizing his analysis of causal necessity to all sorts of non-logical necessities. This generalization means that every concept of necessity is reducible to logical necessity plus the state of affairs which (in accordance with the bases-theory of necessity) is presupposed by that concept. In consequence, knowledge of modal statements in question is possible if we can determine the basis of the statement, whether or not this basis obtains and, finally, whether or not the relationship of intensional parthood occurs. We should note that the author has a non-conventionalist view of logical necessity. For him, this kind of necessity is not a product of convention but it is rather determined by the individuals, properties and states of affairs. A philosophically deeper discussion of this view of logical necessity is not provided by the author. This is surprising, given the importance logical necessity possesses in his theoretical framework.

There are two other points of importance in Meixner's book to which we have not referred yet and which do not seem to be directly relevant to his mereological theory. They are his analysis of the concept of conceivability and the distinction between being and existence. For the latter, the author clearly separates two senses of existence (viz., actual existence and numerical existence) and identifies numerical existence with being. It is not clear whether this identification is a mere conventional stipulation for the sake of simplicity or the author really wants to offer an interpretation of the concept of being, that is, of the notion that is the focus of many metaphysical discussions.  If it is an interpretation that he has in mind, an argument justifying it would be needed in the book. In any case, Meixner uses his distinction to disqualify an epistemological argument against knowledge of mere possibility: either the argument commits the fallacy of equivocation or one of the two premises of the argument is false.

The author discusses the relationship between conceivability and ontic possibility. Initially he offers a brief reason why he thinks conceivability should not be a necessary condition for ontic possibility. However, he wants to determine whether or not it is possible to present an example of ontic possibility which is not conceivable. For this purpose, he distinguishes three senses of conceivability (viz., conceivability as something being understandable, imaginable or mindable) and on this basis he offers a solution to the problem in question. If conceivable means imaginable, examples of inconceivable ontic possibilities can indeed be provided. The tripartite distinction of senses of conceivability also allows the author to give an answer to the question of whether conceivability is a sufficient condition for ontic possibility. In this case, if conceivable means mindable or understandable (in a certain minimal sense), then conceivability is not a sufficient condition for ontic possibility.

We should point out that Meixner restricts conceivability to a certain time framework, that is, "conceivable" for him is just to be conceived by somebody at some time. He applies the same restriction to understandability, mindability, and imaginability. It is not exactly clear, but it seems that he has in mind only the time framework of the actual world. In any case, the only justification he offers for his restrictions is that for something to be conceived (understood, etc.) it is required that it be conceived (understood, etc.) by somebody. We do not find this to be sufficient for justifying the restrictions. If being conceivable (understandable, etc.) must invoke an agent, this agent does not necessarily have to be portrayed as existing within the time framework of that world. We might speak of an ideal agent (whose conditions are not so constrained as those, for example, of agents in the actual world) as one (if not the only one) of the agents involved in the concepts of conceivable, understandable, etc. Meixner should justify ruling out this ideal agent from the concepts in question before restricting them to a certain time framework.