The Thin Justice of International Law: A Moral Reckoning of the Law of Nations

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Steven R. Ratner, The Thin Justice of International Law: A Moral Reckoning of the Law of Nations, Oxford University Press, 2015, 471pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198704041.

Reviewed by Carmen Pavel, King's College London


International law reaches deep into our ordinary lives. Thousands of treaties regulate everything from trade in agricultural products to air transport, rights in coastal waters, telecommunications, the release of chlorofluorocarbons into the atmosphere, appropriate conduct in war, state territorial integrity, and criminal responsibility. Given their pervasive effects, treaties, conventions, customary rules and organizations in charge of making, applying and interpreting them, such as the World Trade Organization (WTO), the International Criminal Court, and the United Nations must comply with the basic requirements of justice. Yet the ready-made vocabulary of justice -- rights, liberty, equality, fairness, stability -- is a poor fit for the institutions of international law.

This poor fit is due to the fact that the vocabulary of justice was created for the institutions of the modern state. We ask if those institutions protect liberty and individual rights, if they prevent discrimination based on race or social status, if they ensure equality of opportunity and the protection of the poor and vulnerable, if they are strong enough to ensure stability such that individuals and groups can go about living their lives without having to fear regular violence. It is less clear if these questions are relevant for international law, and in what way. If international law is to protect equality or rights, should it protect the equality and rights of states or individuals, or both? Should there be a non-discrimination rule in international law, and if so, what should its purpose be? Is the point of international peace and stability the preservation of states, or of individuals, and in case of conflict, which should give way? Whose liberty matters in international law?

These unanswered questions are a clear sign that we must do the hard work to adapt the vocabulary of justice to the reality of international law. This book by Steven R. Ratner makes good progress in this direction. Combining insights from philosophy and international law, the book offers two criteria or pillars for evaluating the justice of international law. International law rules are deemed just only if they (1) advance international and intrastate peace and (2) respect, in the sense of do not interfere with, basic rights. This evaluative standard may seem narrow or unambitious, but it launches an overview of the rules of international law impressive in its range and depth.

The book has five parts. The first situates the 'thin' standard within existing debates on global justice. The second focuses on the justice of core norms regulating state interaction, such as sovereign equality, territorial integrity, and non-interference with the internal affairs of a state. The third discusses the territoriality of human rights norms, namely the idea that the most important obligation of states is to protect rights on their own territory, with a few important exceptions deriving from universal jurisdiction or humanitarian intervention. The next section assesses the justice of global trade and investment norms, where peace and human rights have an important but indirect role to play, and for which the most fundamental rule is non-discrimination in states' treatment of one another. The rule of non-discrimination says that in their trade relations, states cannot treat one country more favorably than another in terms of tariffs, access to the internal market, or rules regulating the safety of imported products provided those countries are WTO members. And finally, the book discusses the limits of the thin justice framework.

Ratner's extensive experience as an expert and adviser to the Unites States' government, international non-governmental organizations and various international institutions on a wide range of issues related to the arbitration of investment disputes, ethnic conflict and human rights violations, territorial disputes, and counter-terrorism strategies brings rich texture to the discussion of the effects of international law rules on protecting peace and respecting human rights. This feature is reason enough to read the book, for a reader unfamiliar with international law will gain more than a basic understanding of its operation. It also marks the book as a vast improvement over the ample scholarly discourse on global justice, which has paid scant attention to the way in which international law operates and the values it embodies. International law is at best marginal to such discourse, and if it plays any role at all is to serve as a contrast to strongly idealized concepts of an international global order.

The book will draw global justice theorists into the realm of practice by emphasizing existing features that are rightly subject of praise. The norms of sovereign equality, noninterference into the affairs of other states, and the ban on the use of force are essential to an understanding of justice at the international level. Ratner not only explains how these norms advance peace and therefore justice, but also makes a new contribution to debates about the proper understanding of the rights of states. For example, the right to self-defense is one of the only two exceptions permitted in international law to the ban on the use of force. He argues that taking away the right of self-defense from unjust states -- a position that some defend -- is neither a way to increase international peace nor to better protect human rights. Opening up states that routinely violate human rights norms to invasion is likely to lead to additional human rights violations via the wide-spread killing that intervention involves, and would reduce overall stability and peace.

The right to self-defense and other international legal rules are important not just because they affect the feasibility of the ideals of global justice, but because they are essential to the moral justification of those ideals in the first place. For example, the fact that we live in a world of independent states, and not in world with a global state, or a world made up of many small, voluntary communities, shapes what kind moral equality is fit for institutions such as ours. Equality of individuals plays an essential, if indirect role though the second pillar, human rights, whose foundational principle is to affirm the equal moral worth of all people. The human rights pillar incorporates Elizabeth Anderson's democratic conception of equality, which emphasizes relational equality focused on eliminating oppression and unequal treatment as opposed to distributional equality. This is standard fare for scholars interested in questions of global justice. But Ratner's contribution is to emphasize the importance of the norm of sovereign equality to international peace and justice.

The core of sovereignty equality consists of a right, a duty, and an immunity: the right to participate in the making of international law on an equal footing with all other states, the duty to obey the norms of international law which bind in the same manner other states party to a treaty, and the immunity from the jurisdiction of other states. Equality of rights and duties does not translate into a kind of perfect formal equality according to which all states signatories to a treaty have the same rights and obligations. For example, the United Nations Convention for the Law of the Sea allows that coastal states have different rights and obligations compared to landlocked states, so the sovereign equality norm is weaker in some respects than the norm of individual equality in domestic law. But the immunity afforded states by sovereign equality is extremely strong, with only very few exceptions allowed for jus cogens norms, which contain prohibitions against the most serious human rights abuses such as genocide, slavery, and ethnic cleansing.

The value of sovereign equality as a recent, contingent, and evolving norm of international law can be highlighted by contemplating a counterfactual world in which sovereign equality is not central to relations among states. Powerful states would enjoy more formal rights than weaker states, and open domination and conquest would be common practice. The constant fight for status and to avoid domination by the powerful would cause profound instability. This is not just a thought experiment, but a description of our world up until the middle of the twentieth century, when war, colonialism, and hierarchy were the central features of international politics. There are still important remnants of that system, and powerful states still manage to get their way in many areas of international law such as international economic law. But the norm of sovereign equality has eroded imbalances of rights and formal hierarchies and continues to do so.

Ratner is taking a side in the ideal-nonideal theory debate, which is a debate about what kinds of idealizing assumptions are acceptable when we think about making the world more just. Justice on the non-ideal account means responding to actual patterns of wrongdoing that we observe in the real world, the pits and valleys of social life rather than the peaks and mountains of ideal theories of justice. If we started with the typical assumptions of global justice theories in which states are considered obsolete and an obstacle to an institutional system that strives for the moral equality of all individuals, we would be missing the moral importance of sovereign equality. Instead we must start with certain features of the international landscape -- and the existence of states and ever present possibility of war are two of the most important ones.

The book speaks to two audiences: moral and political philosophers concerned with understanding the conditions that make the world a place where fairness and respect for people's fundamental rights are the norm rather than the exception, and international lawyers, who engage in the essential work of working within the doctrinal and technical intricacies of the law while setting aside its fundamental goals and moral concerns. Political and moral philosophers could be enriched by seeing that international law can both expand and constrain our repertoire of pathways to implement international justice, and perhaps even give us opportunities to rethink international justice itself. International lawyers could strengthen the application and interpretation of the law with a better understanding of its goals and the trade-offs among them, and ultimately with moral reflection of the kind that ethicists and political philosophers are most apt to provide.

Ratner puts the two camps in conversation with each other with the skill and thoughtfulness of someone who understands well the promise and limitations of both approaches. As a practicing international lawyer and scholar of international law, he is equally at home in the land of trade and investment law, as he is immersed in the intricate and often frustrating squabbles that characterize theorizing about justice.

This book evaluates older, established norms of international law, such as sovereign equality, but also new, emerging, and more divisive norms, such as universal jurisdiction. When evaluating any of these norms, the criteria are the same: is the norm likely to advance peace, and is the norm interfering with basic human rights? Universal jurisdiction, the norm that allows countries to prosecute individuals for crimes committed elsewhere, even when no connection can be established between the prosecuting state and the accused or the victims, is not likely to undermine peace even if it will strain relationships among some states. The number of prosecutions is small enough to have no substantive effect of increasing the likelihood of conflict. In addition, the norm does not interfere with basic human rights, but actually ensures a better protection for them, in a world where individual have so few opportunities to demand redress for wrongs done to them. Universal jurisdiction is not necessarily something that would grow out of most existing theories of global justice, but it is a norm that has evolved with practice and must be seen, at least for now, as an important tool of international law.

The book offers a thoughtful and balanced analysis, and I suspect readers will object less to any claim about specific international rules than to the general theoretical framework. The book delivers on its promise: the account of justice is thin, and while this has several virtues, it has limitations as well. Its virtue lies in the fact that a thin account allows the breadth coverage that would not be possible with a longer list of criteria of evaluation. The limitation consists in the fact that the concept of justice is insufficient to do the work Ratner wants, namely to tell us how far we've come, whether to support the development of international law, and what are the areas in which we should press for change.

The book's conclusion is that in light of the two pillars -- promoting peace and respecting human rights -- international law is 'thinly' or minimally just. This in itself is an important insight, and perhaps surprising to those who, without much thought or knowledge of how international law works in practice, buy into the rhetoric that portrays international law as a system designed to oppress and dominate. Indeed, one of the main contributions of the book is to show that at the micro-level, the making, interpretation, and application of the rules reflects common sense, the protection of morally worthwhile goals, and a careful balancing of trade-offs constantly finessed in the process of amending old rules and negotiating new ones.

What the two pillars do not capture are significant shortcomings and failures of international law that should be made prominent by any account that purports to evaluate its justice. A new evaluating framework which builds on the work the book has already done, but which incorporates other, morally weighty criteria, can illuminate additional features of international law that we have reason to care about. Here are some.

1. The institutions or rules of international law must not only be minimally just in terms of their content, but also emerge from acceptable procedures. A stronger commitment to impartiality, to taking everyone's interests into account, and to equal say in decisions are important for fairness, and protection against encroachment by special interests.

2. Institutions or rules should provide benefits that cannot be obtained otherwise. They must pass an assessment of comparative benefit.

3. Institutions or rules must accomplish the goals they are set up for. Empty human rights agreements with no effect on state practice must be strengthened or abandoned.

4. Institutions or rules must have procedures for accountability and revisability.

Two of these, 1 and 4, deal with procedural justice. 2 evaluates the fundamental justification or reason for the existence of an institution or rule while 3 evaluates its effectiveness. Ratner discusses procedural justice, especially when he discusses institutions whose goal is neither the maintenance of peace nor human rights, such as the case of the WTO. But these additional criteria need more fleshing out.

What is at stake if we go beyond minimal or thin justice to something like a standard of justice that is multidimensional in the way I just described? Take the Security Council for instance. Setting aside minimal justice for now, it would fail on all four of these new criteria I have just listed, even without filling in their content. There is no procedure in place for the accountability and revisability of its decisions, which are final and not open to question by any other forum in international law. Effectiveness is difficult to evaluate because its mandate is vague. The Security Council's mission is not just that of not harming, but of positively advancing international peace. Has it done so? Compared to what?

When it comes to comparative benefit, the case is even weaker for the justice of the Security Council. The veto so often paralyzes its functioning, that it is not that hard to imagine institutional alternatives that would do better. Anything with a majoritarian or supermajoritarian decision procedure would deliver better results. The path to an alternative institutional system would not be easy, but how to get there is a separate question from whether we could imagine something better in its place.

The reasons for paralysis are important as well. When China and Russia vetoed several resolutions considered to address the conflict in Syria, because supporting them would get in the way of their narrow material and political interests, the Security Council failed in its impartiality and the need to take a wide range of interests and perspectives into account. This affected its procedural fairness, and it is perhaps the area of evaluation in which it suffers the most. Both its membership and decision procedures that include veto power constitute a significant deficiency because they end up privileging a small number of powerful states. Ratner does not believe that either the unusual structure of the Security Council or the voting mechanisms it employs have harmed international peace. On the contrary he cites the many resolutions that the council has adopted for peacekeeping, instituting sanctions, and condemning aggression. But the very fact that the vagueness of the Security Council mission leaves so much room for interpretation constitutes a shortcoming of institutional design.

Applying the new evaluative framework makes a big difference. According to the book's existing two pillars of thin justice, the Security Council is unproblematic. With this more expansive standard of justice, it fails dramatically. The judgment of whether it fails or succeeds affects our normative attitude to its decisions (whether we should support the Security Council's judgments or make it more difficult for them to be applied), but also our broader response to questions about institutions reform, such as whether the Security Council should continue to exist in its current form, be significantly reformed, or be scrapped and replaced with a different institution.

We need additional standards because without them we will be missing morally relevant features of the institutional and legal system that we want to evaluate. But Ratner is right that making those standards too demanding will be counterproductive. So for example including distributive justice in the human rights pillar or making the standards of accountability and revisability so strong that it would not be possible for any international institution to meet them in the near future would backfire. It will create a distorted picture of international law, give people reasons for desolation and despair, and it might even turn them away from the idea of working to make it more effective. Despite its minimalism, this book has one remarkable ambition. It seeks to position international law in its proper place as nothing less than the foundation of human civilization, and rightly so. Although it is early days, and a lot could go wrong, Ratner reminds us with cautious optimism that we are on our way.