The Things We Mean

Placeholder book cover

Stephen Schiffer, The Things We Mean, Oxford University Press, 2003, 362 pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199257760.

Reviewed by Peter Pagin, Stockholm University


After Meaning, 1972, and The Remnants of Meaning, 1987, The Things We Mean is Stephen Schiffer's third major work on the foundations of the theory of linguistic meaning. In simplest possible outline, the development started with a positive attempt to base a meaning theory on a modified Gricean account of utterance meaning, but took a negative turn, with the problems of belief sentences as a major reason for thinking that a systematic (compositional) semantic theory for natural language was not possible at all. In the recent book, things have again taken a more positive turn, but now constructive and destructive elements are mixed in complex ways in a complex account, rich in ideas and in detail, and a great challenge to the reader. It is not always obviously free of inner conflict. Nor can one always easily see how things hang together. I shall here try to accurately present the main ideas. Where my comments are not relegated to separate paragraphs, I mark the transition with a dash (--).

First, the right methodology for the theory of linguistic meaning is to ask what knowledge of meaning is knowledge of (chapter 3). Given this, we can conclude that there cannot be a correct meaning theory for a natural language at all, as it has been traditionally conceived. The reason is that such a theory would have to issue theorems of the form

(1) e means m

but there is not in general any substituend for 'm' available for making

(2) S knows that e means m

true, for instance not when e is

(3) 'Is she there yet?'

(p 101). Schiffer goes on to argue (p 102) that the proponent of meaning theories will have to hold either that there is a proper substituend, although we don't yet know what it is, or else the knowledge is ineffable, and there is no good reason for either. -- This does, however, seem like a false dilemma, since even if there is at present no acceptable substituend (this is how I have interpret Schiffer), this might be because we have not yet developed the proper vocabulary. In fact, Schiffer thinks that his own theory of characters* (see below) does not offer acceptable substituends.

Schiffer claims that what holds for (3) should hold for all expressions, and since (1) cannot be satisfied for all, it can be satisfied for none. Hence, not even

(4) 'Snow is white' means that snow is white

provides a proper instance of (1). This is, Schiffer claims, because the sense of 'means' relevant in (4) is not that applicable to sentences but rather to speaker-meaning (p 103). What is actually 'conveyed by' (4) is what a speaker would mean by a literal utterance of 'Snow is white' -- (I guess that, to be consistent, Schiffer should have said here that this is what he, Schiffer, meant by his inscription of (4) on p 103 of his book). No attempt is made to support this claim.

After some discussion of what knowledge of the meaning of an expression e can amount to, Schiffer concludes that knowledge of meaning is whatever state plays the so-called knowledge-of-meaning processing role (pp 115-16). The knowledge-of-meaning processing role is played by a mental state of a cognitive subject H if it is that state by which H manages to process an utterance u of a sentence s by a speaker S to arrive at knowledge of what speech act S performed by means of u. Knowing this is knowing, for some speech act type ψ and some propositional content q, that by means of u, S ψed that q, e.g. that S asked whether there is life on Mars. However, for a state to be a knowledge-of-meaning state it is required that it somehow links the sentence uttered, s, with what Schiffer calls its 'character*', and character* is what Schiffer proposes as linguistic meaning, or else its Ersatz. -- As it appears from this presentation, Schiffer does indeed seem to characterize knowledge of meaning in terms of meaning, rather than, as officially intended, the other way around.

The term 'character*' is chosen to signal that Schiffer's notion is similar to but different from David Kaplan's notion of character. The character* of a sentence s, as Schiffer explains it, is an ordered pair <A, P>, where A is the kind of speech act that an utterance of s must be of, and P is the kind of propositional content that speech act must have (p 112). An explicit example (p 113) is

(5) 'Is it raining?' means <asking-whether, a proposition of the form it's raining at place m at time m', where m identifies a place implicitly referred to by the speaker and m' identifies the time of utterance>

Confronting his positive suggestion with his initial meaning skepticism, and holding that terms referring to characters don't satisfy (2), Schiffer concludes (p 120) that one shouldn't really care whether characters* are meanings or not, once all the facts about understanding are in.

The occurrences of 'must' in the general formulation are not explained, but seem to indicate a normativistic view of linguistic meaning, especially so as in other passages (e.g. p 217) Schiffer refers to principles that 'normatively govern' mental states. Normativity as such is not discussed, however, but it appears that when an indicative sentence is used for a command or a question, as is often the case, we have according to Schiffer a 'non-literal utterance', i.e. an utterance not in accordance with the sentence's meaning (p 111). An example (p 110) would be an imperative use of

(6) You sing it

the meaning of which requires the speech act of 'stating, or saying that'. -- Apparently, the category of non-literal utterances comprises everything from just testing one's voice to cases such as imperative uses of (6), which may seem to make it less than ideal for theoretical purposes.

A kind of proposition is a property of propositions, more or less specific. Judging from examples such as (5), the kind of proposition that is part of a sentence's character* is almost the same as its Kaplanian character (but it is a property rather than a function).

However, Schiffer also assigns kinds of propositions to sub-sentential expressions, and this is explained as follows: "corresponding to a word w is a kind of proposition P such that the propositional content of a literal utterance of any sentence containing w must be a proposition of kind P" (p 111). This is characteristically exemplified, and the case of proper names runs (p 133) like this:

Subject to a certain qualification, the character* of a name n constrains the literal speaker who utters a token of a name to be performing a speech act whose propositional content is an x-dependent proposition, where x is the bearer of the name. The qualification concerns negative existentials and that-clause occurrences, and perhaps other special contexts. In these cases the literal speaker will, to a first approximation, be constrained to mean a proposition that involves a contextually pertinent property associated with the practice of using the name in the linguistic community relevant to the utterance [ … ]

This kind-of-proposition conception of word-meaning is meant as a version of the familiar Fregean idea that the meaning of a word is its contribution to the meanings of sentences containing it (p 111). -- The conception is not fully worked out, however, and Schiffer does not make explicit use of it for this purpose. Nor is it easy to see how it could be so used. For instance, we cannot treat the meaning of 'John smokes' as the intersection of the properties that are the meanings of 'John' and 'smokes', since that intersection property is shared by any sentence containing both 'John' and 'smokes', such as 'When Abe smokes, John sleeps'. Clearly, for the purposes of a compositional semantics, this conception of word-meaning is very weak.

Compositionality is nonetheless a recurrent theme in the book, but it is not easy to discern a consistent line. On the one hand Schiffer does suggest (pp 117-18, 160) that a compositional character* theory for a language L is a good thing to have, since on the assumption that such a theory is internally represented by a hearer, we get an account of how a novel utterance can be understood. It explains how the knowledge of the character* of the words of an uttered sentence s, together with knowledge of the structure of s, generates knowledge of the character* of s itself (this is complicated by later remarks; see below).

On the other hand, Schiffer also makes a number of negative remarks about the possibility and need for compositional semantics. To begin with, he claims (pp 74-79, pp 81-82) that, unlike for other complex expressions, the reference of that-clauses in belief reports is determined by contextual criteria of evaluation rather than by the referents of the component parts. What is meant by that is not so easy to understand. For example, Schiffer says that two literal utterances of

(7) Ralph believes that George Eliot was a woman

may differ in truth value, because in the one context but not in the other the truth of the utterance requires thinking of George Eliot as a famous writer (p 75). Further, we know that the sentences

(8) a. Lois believes that Superman flies

b. Lois believes that Clark Kent flies

may differ in truth value, and that is why we know that the two embedded that-clauses differ in reference, not the other way around (p 77).

Schiffer claims (p 82) that the criteria of evaluation don't have to determine referents for the components of the that-clause in order to determine the referent for the that-clause itself, in which case of course the referent of the that-clause wouldn't be compositionally determined from the referents of its parts. -- But his examples show at most a certain context dependence in reference determination of the component parts, something that does not violate the compositionality of that-clause reference.

The next attack on compositionality consists in questioning the availability of what Schiffer calls 'propositional building blocks', that can be the referents of expressions in that-clauses (pp 82-84). -- However, without going into the details of Schiffer's discussion of propositional building blocks, it may be noted that it simply is a mistake to suppose that compositionality requires that referents of the parts of an expression e are parts of the referent of e itself (regardless of whether this referent is something structured; this mistake is made also on pp 17 and 88). To the extent that the compositionality hypothesis is that 'the referent of a that-clause token is determined by its structure and the referents its component expressions have in that token' (p 17), it just isn't refuted by the conclusion that there aren't any good propositional building blocks around.

Thirdly, there is a criticism of the claim that compositional semantics has explanatory value. Suppose we have a compositional supervenience theory (167), i.e. a theory that derives supervenience base properties of complex mentalese expressions from the supervenience base properties of their parts. The supervenience base properties are, roughly, such that being in a state that has such a propertyφ and tokens a representation of a sentence s is metaphysically (or nomically) sufficient for believing L(s), i.e. having a belief with the propositional content that is the meaning of s in mentalese language L.

This theory doesn't tell us why a particular non-intentional property is the supervenience base for a particular intentional property. Now you might think (p 170) that having a compositional semantics together with a compositional supervenience theory enjoys an explanatory advantage over just having the supervenience theory, for in the former case there are only finitely many correlations to explain, the basic ones, while without the compositional semantics there are infinitely many correlations to explain. But this is wrong, according to Schiffer. For the best we can do with the basic correlations, e.g. explain why 'dog' means dog (p 172), is in some sense to 'demystify' (p 173) the statements of those correlations, and account for our intuitions about them. And (p 174), we can do exactly the same thing with the complex expressions, without the need of compositional semantics. So there is no explanatory advantage.

We are not told much about what demystifying would consist in over and above that after demystification, the correlations would seem unremarkable. Nor are we told why deriving non-basic correlation propositions from basic, demystified, correlation propositions does not have a greater explanatory value than simply demystifying the non-basic ones too. After all, an explanation of A from B still is one even if we cannot also explain B.

Above all, it remains unclear whether a compositional character* theory after all does not have any value for explaining utterance understanding, contrary to what Schiffer had suggested earlier, or whether he in fact didn't suggest it earlier (but only considered the possibility), or whether again its value for explaining understanding does not depend on its value for explaining the supervenience of meaning properties on base properties. It is natural to think that the ability of compositional semantics to explain understanding rests on its ability to predict/explain the meaning of new sentences, and precisely this (except that there is a shift from natural language to mentalese) is what is called into doubt in the later discussion. I have not been able to determine how Schiffer combines these passages.

Lastly, there is a final positive twist, since according to Schiffer the non-compositionality of that-clause reference does not prevent a compositional truth theory. How Schiffer's version of a truth theory handles belief sentences is exemplified on p 177. The theorem for (7) would run:

(9) An utterance of (7) is true iff ∃p(Necessarily(p is true iff George Eliot was a woman) & p is determined by such-and-such contextual factors & Ralph believes p).

-- However, this isn't right, since (9) is true when Ralph believes some proposition or other that is necessarily equivalent with the proposition that George Eliot was a woman, even if (7) itself is false.

All in all, the stance of Schiffer 2003 on compositionality is a hard one to figure out. What is clear, on the other hand, is that Schiffer 2003 is for semantics itself, for relating utterances to propositions and sentences to kinds of propositions. We need propositions for their role in propositional attitude attributions, and we need propositional attitude attributions for their great predictive and counterfactual value with respect to action (pp. 347-48).The reason we need propositions for propositional attitude attributions is that the face-value theory for belief sentences is true. According the face-value theory, a sentence of the form

(10) A believes that S

is true just in case what 'A' refers to stands in the belief relation to what 'that S' refers to (p 12). It is argued in chapter 1 that the face-value theory is needed in particular to account for the intuitive validity of inferences like

(11) Harold believes everything Fiona says

Fiona says that there is life on Venus

So, Harold believes that there is life on Venus

apparently involving quantification into that-clause position of attitude attributions. Most of the chapter is a survey and discussion of known problems for theories of belief sentences. The main candidates are Russellian theories, Fregean theories, and hidden-indexical theories. This is an area where Schiffer is a leading expert, and the discussion is accordingly excellent. -- This reader only wondered why on pp. 27-30 Schiffer writes as if quantifying into Fregean indirect contexts is a recently discovered problem, given e.g. a classic like David Kaplan's 'Quantifying in'.

Given this extended argument for the need of propositions to refer to and quantify over, one could have expected an indispensability argument for an ontology of propositions. But this is not what Schiffer does. Instead he launches in chapter 2 into an argument for so-called pleonastic entities generally, of which pleonastic propositions are a special case. The idea of pleonastic entities is motivated to a great extent by the assumption that we can have them with no or very small metaphysical costs.

A pleonastic entity is an entity that falls under a pleonastic concept; and a pleonastic concept is the concept of an F that implies true so-called something-from-nothing-F-entailment claims (p 57). This in turn is defined as follows, where ⇒ expresses metaphysical necessity:

(12) S ⇒ ∃xFx is a something-from-nothing-entailment claim iff

i) the antecedent is metaphysically possible but doesn't logically entail either its consequent or any statement of the form '∃x(x = a)', where 'a' refers to an F, and

ii) the concept of an F is such that if there are Fs, then S ⇒ ∃xFx (I'll say that the concept of an F 'implies' a something-from-nothing-entailment claim if it satisfies (ii)).

(pp. 56-57). Schiffer's first examples of pleonastic entities are fictional entities. In this case the something-from-nothing-entailment claim is the thesis that

(13) The existence of fictional entities supervenes on the pretending use of their names

and Schiffer holds (p 52) that this is a conceptual truth, knowable a priori via command of the concept ( -- this is probably a better way of relating the concept to the entailment claim, as concept implication according to clause ii) of (12) gives (13) only conditionally on the existence of the entities). Since we know ourselves to have a pretending use of fictional names, we may conclude that fictional entities exist.

This is then also applied to properties and propositions, by way of something-from-nothing transformations like

(14) x is F. So, x has the property of being F.

(15) The proposition that S is true iff S

(pp. 67, 72), giving us pleonastic properties and pleonastic propositions, respectively.

As far as I can see, nothing Schiffer says stops us from applying the method to generate pleonastic entities according to taste. We can e.g. define 'quee' by the following transformation

(16) At location l there is a quee iff at location l, there has been a bee.

giving us an ontology of pleonastic quees (which I guess we can do well without). The quees supervene on past spatial distributions of bees.

Schiffer does use a method (borrowed from Hartry Field's Science Without Numbers) to ensure that the ontological extension is conservative (pp. 56-59). The idea is to restrict the domain of a prior theory T to entities that don't fall under the new pleonastic concept F, and then require the following:

(17) For any sentence s in the language of T, if s is logically entailed by the restricted theory T~F in conjunction with something-from-nothing-F-entailment claims, then it is logically entailed byT~F alone.

This method ingeniously does block some candidate counterexamples. -- Nevertheless, it is a very weak form of conservativeness, and it lets the quees through.

Moreover, the transformation schema for properties is in effect a naïve comprehension schema, generating Grelling's paradox via

(18) Doghood is a property that doesn't instantiate itself.

So, doghood has the property of being a property that doesn't instantiate itself.

(p 67). Schiffer is quick to note this, but instead of taking it to invalidate the schema, he refers to his doctrine of so-called unhappy-face solutions of paradoxes (see below), and simply thinks that we should accept the schema despite not being able to eliminate the paradox.

In the case of propositions, finally, Schiffer's view is that propositions as pleonastic entities aren't characterized by (15) alone, but also by our use of that-clauses in propositional attitude attributions, with their complex context sensitivity. This means in particular that pleonastic propositions are individuated according to their role in attitude attributions, given our intuitive truth value distributions over such attributions (e.g. reckoning that (8a) and (8b) may differ in truth value).

He notes a certain conflict here (p 87-88), for in the inference

(19) Julius Caesar died before 1933.

So, that Julius Caesar died before 1933 is true

no attribution is made, but that-clause reference is still effected. How is that reference contextually determined? Schiffer's answer is that the that-clause in the conclusion of (19) refers to the proposition expressed by the utterance of the premise, which is contextually determined. -- But this does not involve the criteria of evaluation that were stressed as essential for attitude reports, and so it becomes less clear what the source of the context dependence is.

The further view, that there is nothing more to pleonastic propositions than what is given by our use of that-clauses, may be taken as implicit in the presentation above, but is made explicit (p 212) in the remaining part of the book (chapters 5-7), dealing with some persistently hard problems for the concept of a proposition: vagueness, conditionals and moral statements.

After giving an overview of the current main theoretical alternatives regarding vagueness, and their well-known problems, Schiffer introduces the key to his solution for all three areas, the so-called vagueness-related partial beliefs (v-beliefs, or VPBs, p 201). VPBs are like subjective probabilities (s-beliefs) in being of partial strength, measurable on the real interval between 0 and 1 (but in this case, the interval is open; it does not include the end-points). Further characteristics (p 202) are that the measure of a VPB is not a measure of uncertainty and that they don't give rise to likelihood beliefs (beliefs that such-and-such is more or less likely). Also, "if one v-believes p to any degree between 0 and 1, and one's epistemic circumstances are known by one to be ideal ([ … ]), then one won't feel that one, or anyone else, can get into a better epistemic position with respect to p".

To complete the introduction of the concept of VPBs, Schiffer adds an example of a person presented with a borderline case of baldness (p 202-03), where the subject is in an ideal situation for judging baldness, including knowing the exact number of hairs on the head, and knowing the situation to be ideal. Her degree of belief will be in the mid-range, corresponding to her willingness to make a qualified assertion. What she has, according to Schiffer, is a VPB.

It is not made explicit what the measure of VPB measures, but judging from the example, it appears that the numerical value of a VPB is to correspond to the subject's willingness to make a qualified assertion. Schiffer says further that the difference between VPBs and subjective probabilities comes out in the fact that VPBs don't satisfy the axioms of probability, or don't satisfy the formula

(20) VPB(q/p) = VPB(p&q)/VPB(q).

Here VPB(q/p) is the degree to which one believes p, given q. Schiffer thinks that VPBs satisfy neither. He argues by appeal to intuition (p 204) that unlike subjective probabilities, the degree of VPB in the conjunction of two independent propositions does not have their product as its value. Thus, if Sally v-believes to degree 0.5 that Tom is bald, and v-believes to degree 0.5 that Tom is thin, and also thinks that the truth of the one is irrelevant to the truth of the other, she will not v-believe to degree 0.25 that Tom is bald and thin, but again to degree 0.5. And the reason is that Sally is ambivalent rather than uncertain. -- Personally, I have found it difficult to really get the hang of the intuitions Schiffer appeals to here.

After considering combinations of uncertainty and ambivalence, i.e. a state one is in when one is uncertain about the basis for a VPB, Schiffer comes to the next key concept. A VPB* is a VPB formed under ideal epistemic circumstances, when the subject knows herself to have relevant knowledge of basic determining facts (p 207). The concept of VPB is then used (p 209) for defining indeterminacy:

(C) p is indeterminate iff someone could v*-believe p

Moreover, Schiffer defines what it is to be a borderline case of a concept F, in terms of a concept-driven VPB*, where a VPB* is F-concept-driven if the subject's concept of an F precludes her from s-believing that it does or does not apply, but does yield a v-belief:

(E) x is a borderline case of being F iff someone could have an F-concept-driven VPB* that x is F.

The concept of indeterminacy is then used for solving the sorites paradox. According to Schiffer, the inductive premise of a sorites inference, like ii) of

(21) i) A person with $50 million is rich.

ii) ∀n(a person with $n is rich → a person with $n-1 is also rich).

iii) ∴ A person with only 37¢ is rich.

is indeterminate, thus neither determinately true nor determinately false (pp. 222-24).

This may look like a fairly mainstream solution to the sorites, in that a particular kind of fault is located with the inductive premise of the inference. Once this fault is noted and explained, we should see that the inference does not go through, and hence avoid the contradiction. However, this is not how it works in Schiffer's case. As Schiffer explicitly notes (p 224), validity is a semantic concept, but his notion of indeterminacy is a psychological concept. -- Hence, it seems that the indeterminacy of the inductive premise does not have any bearing on the validity of the inference, and since Schiffer grants the truth of the minor premise and falsity of the conclusion, we are not guarded against a contradiction after all.

Still, in this part of the book, Schiffer often writes as if he takes truth (or falsity) of a proposition and indeterminacy of that proposition to be in some sort of conflict. He writes that, given indeterminacy, it is indeterminate whether classical logic is correct. Modus ponens may take us from true premises to an indeterminate conclusion, and from indeterminate premises to a false conclusion, along a sorites chain. So classical logic does not preserve determinate truth, nor indeterminacy.

We may be helped here by Schiffer's view on paradox solution (pp 196-98). A happy-face solution to a paradox identifies the faulty premise, explains why it is false and why we have been prone to believe it. On Schiffer's view, most classical paradoxes just don't have happy-face solutions. They reveal glitches in our concepts rather than mistakes. A weak unhappy-face solution (198) tells us that there cannot be a happy-face solution, and that a suitable consistent revision of our concept is possible.. A strong unhappy-face solution is as the weak one, except that it instead denies that a consistent suitable revision is possible.

Accordingly, Schiffer is clear that he has not offered a happy-face solution to the sorites (and thinks there isn't any). The more interesting question, he says (p 225) is whether there is a weak or a strong unhappy-face solution. In the case of the sorites, a weak solution would be adopting an alternative logic, a logic that is certain to preserve determinate truth. Schiffer considers the advantages of a Lukasiewiczian many-valued logic in this respect, but concludes that its semantic values cannot be interpreted as degrees of truth. Because of that, it is not in conflict with classical logic, and adopting it for the sake of reasoning with indeterminacy would not be a revision of classical logic, hence not a weak happy-face solution. With this conclusion, according to Schiffer (p 230), the weak/strong issue has lost most of its interest.

Indeterminacy plays the key role also in the treatments of conditionals and of moral judgments. -- And in these chapters a further difficulty with this notion comes to the surface. The difficulty is that there is in general no guarantee that the belief of a cognitive subject with respect to an indeterminate proposition is a v-belief. An epistemicist about vagueness, such as Tim Williamson, who thinks that there is sharp boundary of baldness, although we cannot know where it is, will apparently have an s-belief rather than a v-belief about a borderline case of baldness. With respect to Schiffer's official definition of indeterminacy of a proposition, which only requires that someone may have a VPB* about it, it is not wrong to have an s-belief, and Williamson need not disagree with Schiffer about the indeterminacy, in Schiffer's sense, of the proposition. Still, it appears that on Schiffer's psychological theory, a belief about a borderline case 'goes willy-nilly into one's VPB box' (p 260). Hence, on Schiffer's view, apparently, epistemicists are simply mistaken about their own mental states. They think they are uncertain, but are really ambivalent.

In the case of morals (chapter 6), there is no such self-deception about one's own beliefs. Here Schiffer is for a weak version of moral cognitivism: since propositions are pleonastic, we have no good reason to reject the existence of moral propositions. On the other hand these propositions are not determinately true or false. For (p 254) one can take oneself to know all the relevant normative and non-normative facts, and still be torn between believing and not believing a moral principle. Then it must be a VPB. Moreover, even moral realists, who really believe in the determinate truth or falsity of moral propositions, display practical VPB ambivalence in moral borderline cases. They need philosophical reflection to realize that the moral propositions they believe are indeterminate (p. 260) -- !

In chapter 7, finally, Schiffer discusses conditionals, mostly indicative conditionals, even though his treatment of subjunctives is similar. On p 285, he gives his final proposal for truth conditions for indicative-conditional propositions:

(22) AC is determinately true iff (a) both A and C are determinately true or (b) it is determinately the case that A metaphysically or physically entails C, and determinately false iff (a) A is determinately true and C is determinately false or (b) it is determinately the case that A metaphysically or physically entails ¬C (but not C).

Indicative conditionals are indeterminate when neither determinately true nor determinately false. -- Here, if the notion of indeterminacy is the same as above, there is no clear separation of semantics and psychology.

The motivation behind (22) is that when we contemplate an indicative conditional with an antecedent we know to be false, we imagine ourselves in relevant scenarios where we are uncertain of the antecedent and contemplate what P(C/A) would be for us in such a scenario (pp. 281, 284). What we come up with then, according to Schiffer, is the degree to which we v-believe AC. Hence, the conditional is indeterminate.

Schiffer is keen to note (pp. 286-87) that this account does not offer a happy-face solution to the problem of indicative conditionals. For we can have a rational thinker Ann who has the following subjective probabilities:

(23) P(P) = 0.5

P(P&R) = 0.25

P(P& ¬R) = 0.25

P(R/P) = 0.5

Schiffer observes that his theory would give the verdict that Ann s-believes P R to degree 0.25, s-believes ¬(P R) to degree 0.25, and v-believes those propositions to degrees which sum to 0.5. What we find, according to Schiffer, is that Ann s-believes P R to degree 0.5.

So what to do? Schiffer notes that it seems that he must either say that speakers are mistaken in their beliefs about indicative-conditionals, or else give up his views about pleonastic propositions, indeterminacy or his proposed truth conditions of indicative conditionals. Schiffer's comment is that the truth is somewhere 'in between', and moves on to characterize this stance as an unhappy-face solution. It is a weak unhappy face solution, since we can get rid of our problems by ceasing to use the same form of words to express both the material conditional and conditional belief (p 288). We can get by with different expressions for these functions, and simply give up the use of indicative-conditional propositions.

Maybe Schiffer is right that we cannot do better. In this case, however, the ingredients that jointly lead to contradiction involve several of Schiffer's own theories. The contradiction then reveals glitches in our concepts only to the extent that our concepts are aptly characterized by Schiffer's theories, something which is not completely obvious. Even describing his view as an unhappy-face solution is therefore controversial, i.e. to the extent that unhappy-face solutions are characteristic of such glitches.

As here indicated, Schiffer's book is rich, complex and thought provoking, and at times ingenious. Time will tell whether it will command the same admiration as its two predecessors.