The Thinking of the Sensible: Merleau-Ponty's A-Philosophy

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Mauro Carbone, The Thinking of the Sensible: Merleau-Ponty's A-Philosophy, Northwestern University Press, 2004, 136pp, $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 0810119862.

Reviewed by Taylor Carman, Barnard College, Columbia University


Merleau-Ponty spent the years just prior to his death in 1961 extending, rethinking, and in some cases revising ideas that had been at the center of his philosophical work since the 1930s. Early and late, he always tried to break down traditional dualisms, above all those of sensibility and understanding, activity and passivity, inner and outer, mind and body.

Merleau-Ponty's final, unfinished work, The Visible and the Invisible (published in 1964), carries that reconciling project to new depths, and indeed new extremes, to include the past and the present, and the body and its surrounding environment. In a famously self-critical note from 1959, he confesses, "The problems posed in Ph.P. [Phenomenology of Perception] are insoluble because I start there from the 'consciousness'-'object' distinction."[1] In the last phase of his thinking he therefore strives ever more resolutely to free himself from the received view of intentionality as subjectivity standing over against and external to objects radically heterogeneous with it, and as occupying a specious present sharply distinct from past and future moments in a linear temporality. Body and world, like past and present, he now insists, are "interwoven" in such a way that seemingly neat conceptual distinctions between them are bound to distort and misrepresent the phenomena as we actually live and understand them in preconceptual, prereflective, prearticulate ways.

Grasping the essential ambiguity of the phenomena moreover demands that we forsake the rigorous aspirations of traditional metaphysics and epistemology in favor of what Merleau-Ponty calls the "nonphilosophy" of post-Hegelian thinkers like Marx, Kierkegaard, and Nietzsche. The grand aspirations of systematic philosophers such as Kant and Hegel, that is, must give way to a new kind of concrete, descriptive, perhaps merely evocative inquiry situated essentially if uneasily between the empirical and the transcendental, or in Heideggerian terms, the ontic and the ontological.

Such a conception of philosophy and its object runs a considerable risk of obscurity, not to say obscurantism, and indeed Merleau-Ponty's late notes often seem to tread a fine line between depth and emptiness. Recurring images of "chiasm" and the "intertwining" of body and world, and of past and present, work powerfully as metaphors, but they also cry out for some lucid, demystifying philosophical interpretation.

Unfortunately, the four essays in Mauro Carbone's collection, The Thinking of the Sensible: Merleau-Ponty's A-Philosophy, do little to dispel the fog and separate the light from the darkness in Merleau-Ponty's late works. The first, "The Time of Half-Sleep," describes Merleau-Ponty's eventual abandonment of Husserl's theory of time consciousness, a version of which he himself had advanced in Phenomenology of Perception more than a decade earlier, in favor of Proust's idea that memory can put us in touch with an "atemporal" and "indestructible" past that abides and clings to the present in a nonlinear way. The second essay, "Ad Limina Philosophiae," purports to find a conception of "absolute knowledge" in Merleau-Ponty's account of the point in the Introduction to The Phenomenology of Spirit where, he thinks, Hegel lapses from the virtuous circularity of "aphilosophy" into dogmatism and contempt for ordinary understanding. The third, "Nature," combines Jacob von Uexküll's account of organisms constituting their own environments, like a melody "singing itself" (30), with Merleau-Ponty's notion of "voyance," that is, vision or insight into intelligible forms, inspired in part by Rimbaud's "Lettre du voyant."

The fourth essay, "The Thinking of the Sensible," is the shortest and, to my mind, the most interesting. Here Carbone describes Merleau-Ponty's attempt to reinterpret concepts and conceptuality in such a way as to overcome the putative distinction between the passivity of the senses and the spontaneity of the intellect, and indeed between the subject itself and the intelligible forms it grasps as supposedly distinct and discrete entities. Carbone quotes Mario Perniola, who has observed that the Latin conceptus and concipio have the "opposite semantic orientation" (47) to the German Begriff and begreifen. Whereas the latter connote seizing and manipulating, the former suggest concavity and receptivity; think of conceiving a child, as opposed to conceiving a plan. Carbone suggests that Merleau-Ponty's account of the intermediate place of thinking between activity and passivity is superior to Heidegger's notion of Gelassenheit, which inspired it. This suggestion, however, relies on two extremely quick and unsatisfying arguments: first, that because Heidegger talks about trying to achieve Gelassenheit, he therefore cannot distinguish the attitude he has in mind from the voluntarism, indeed the willfulness, he criticizes in figures like Schopenhauer and Nietzsche; and second, that Heidegger's passing reference to a "restless to and fro between yes and no"[2] indicates that he had not managed to appreciate what Merleau-Ponty calls "the initial yes, the undividedness of feeling" (44). But what is that, exactly? And did Heidegger really not appreciate it, or was he merely observing the extraordinary difficulty of appreciating such a thing?

The book begins and ends with references to a passage in which Merleau-Ponty expresses "his sense of a profound dissonance, a transformation in the relationship between humanity and Being, when he holds up a universe of classical thought, contrasting it en bloc with the explorations of modern painting."[3] Carbone sees that sense of transformation at work in Merleau-Ponty's later writings generally, but he says nothing very definite about its significance or philosophical implications. What Carbone's essays offer, instead, is generally rather obscure paraphrase of some already rather obscure primary material, which Carbone quotes liberally (and repetitively) throughout. To pick one example at random, in his account of the self-constitution or "institution" of meaning in experience and the peculiar way in which the past penetrates or infuses the present in memory in a kind of "simultaneity," Carbone asks,

What in fact does simultaneity indicate, if not the chiasm of presence and absence sketched by the relation between visible and invisible? And how, then, does the relation -- on which the institution feeds -- between the sedimented presence of the instituted element and the latency of possibilities of the instituting element appear, except as the chiasmic relation between visible and invisible? (7)

How indeed? These sentences seem to be spinning their wheels, repeating and recasting Merleau-Ponty's jargon, rather than advancing our understanding of either the texts or the things themselves.

There are moreover several points in The Thinking of the Sensible where I believe Carbone is subtly mistaken about what Merleau-Ponty wants to say about the complex relation, or interrelation, between reflection and prereflective experience, between thinking and the sensible. Put simply, Carbone seems to deny that, for Merleau-Ponty, one is more basic than the other. Instead, he refers to "the unreflected and reflection in their co-originality and circularity" (17, emphasis added), and to "the co-originality and reversibility of savage consciousness and reflected consciousness" (23-4, emphasis added). Similarly, he writes, "language is co-originating with brute being" (40).

The texts Carbone cites in support of these claims, it seems to me, fall somewhat short of supporting them. Specifically, although Merleau-Ponty writes at length about the interconnectedness and reciprocity of thought and perception, the reflected and the unreflected, I don't think he regards the two as strictly speaking "co-original." Granted, he comes very close to saying so in the passage from The Visible and the Invisible to which Carbone refers following the first of the three passages quoted above. If, in "the great philosophies of reflection … the circle of the unreflected and reflection is deliberate," Merleau-Ponty argues, then

there is no longer any philosophy of reflection, for there is no longer the originating and the derived; there is a thought traveling a circle where the condition and the conditioned, the reflection and the unreflected, are in a reciprocal, if not symmetrical relationship, and where the end is in the beginning as much as the beginning is in the end. (VI 34-5)

So far so good, for Carbone's reading, though to quibble, it seems to me the phrase "if not (sinon) symmetrical" is ambiguous. Is the relation symmetrical or not? I would say not. At least the wording concedes that reciprocity does not entail symmetry; think of the "equal and opposite" action and reaction of the cue ball and the eight ball.

More significant is the fact that this passage is part of an imagined debate with an advocate of "the great philosophies of reflection," which is to say the Continental rationalists and the German idealists, and that Merleau-Ponty is trying, in his usual conciliatory way, to preserve what he thinks is still valid in their notion of the essential, if only partial, openness of the world to thought. What Merleau-Ponty does not intend to concede in all this is the interlocutor's insistence

that one begins with the unreflected, because one does have to begin, but that the universe of thought that is opened up by reflection contains everything necessary to account for the mutilated thought of the beginning, which is only the ladder one pulls up after oneself after having climbed it. (VI 35)

This is not Merleau-Ponty's view. Unreflective perceptual experience is not, for him, simply "mutilated thought," and so not just an arbitrary starting point for either philosophy or common sense, a merely heuristic foothold by which to pull ourselves up into the circle of a self-constituting sense that somehow owes as much to the most explicit and transparent achievements of reflection as to our most primitive sensory and bodily capacities. Thought transforms the sensible in a multitude of ways, but that does not make the former equiprimordial with the latter.

Indeed, Merleau-Ponty concludes this passage by insisting that even the most basic form of reflective awareness remains parasitic on the world it encounters prereflectively, which therefore always manages to surpass and resist it: "What is given is not a massive and opaque world, or a universe of adequate thought; it is a reflection which turns back over the density of the world in order to clarify it, but which, coming second (après coup), reflects back to it only its own light" (VI 35). Later, in a similar vein, he writes, "if we make thought appear upon an infrastructure of vision, this is only in virtue of the uncontested evidence that one must see or feel in some way in order to think, that every thought known to us occurs to a flesh" (VI 146). Thought, for Merleau-Ponty, is rooted in the "flesh" (chair) common to our bodies and the perceptible world. As much as perception may be shaped and colored by thought, and as much as the two may be intertwined in complex ways, it is not the case that the "density" of the flesh is in turn rooted in the transparency of reflection. The relation between them is surely reciprocal, not symmetrical.

Similarly, Carbone supports his claim that "language is co-originating with brute being" (40) by citing Merleau-Ponty's remark concerning the human body that "the structure of its mute world is such that all possibilities of language are already given in it" (VI 155). But again, to say that bodily intentionality makes linguistic meaning possible is not to say that language itself already somehow plays a constitutive role in the intentionality of bodily attitudes and skills.

[1] The Visible and the Invisible, A. Lingis, trans. (Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1968), 200. Hereafter VI.

[2] Heidegger, Discourse on Thinking, J. M. Anderson and E. H. Freund, trans. (New York: Harper & Row, 1966), 75.

[3] "Eye and Mind," in The Merleau-Ponty Aesthetics Reader: Philosophy and Painting, G. A. Johnson and M. B. Smith, eds. (Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1993), 139.