The Thought of Death and the Memory of War

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Marc Crépon, The Thought of Death and the Memory of War, Michael Loriaux (tr.), University of Minnesota Press, 2013, 165pp., $22.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780816680061.

Reviewed by Dawne McCance, St. John's College, University of Manitoba


In his Foreword to Marc Crépon’s book, Rodolphe Gasché suggests that what it offers, above all, is a new history of the segment of continental philosophical thought that, in the wake of the violence of two world wars, was determined by a critical debate between French and German thinkers over Martin Heidegger's thought on death. In a moment of post-war disillusionment, when philosophical thought itself, along with the possibility of living together at all, were put "radically into question" (ix), participants in the debate responded with some urgency to Heidegger's notion of Being-toward-death. As Gasché is careful to point out, and as is evident in Crépon's history of it, this debate over Heidegger's thesis on death is presided over by high standards, never exploiting or dismissing the thinker's work for reason of his association with the national-socialist regime, as has often been the case in media circles and in academia as well -- and as no doubt will happen again given the recent, already sensationalized, publication of the first of Heidegger's Schwarze Hefte, his so-called "Black Books." The debate to which Gasché refers was prompted by the need "to rethink thought from the ground up" (x) and is still ongoing. Crépon contributes decisively to it himself, not only with his often profound readings of relevant work by the thinkers involved, but also with his own response to Heidegger's thesis on death, which is laid out in the first chapter, and woven into the following chapters, of his book.

The book opens with an Introduction in which, drawing from Freud's 1915 text, Zeitgemässes über Krieg und Tod, or Reflections on War and Death, Crépon foregrounds two phenomena that Freud suggests converge during time of war: the disillusionment that war induces, and the change in our attitude to death that it engenders. Disillusionment follows when humanity's "highest civilization" turns the foreigner into the enemy, whose death, unlike our own, we are supposed to cause or to will. It is as if war returns us to Freud's fiction of "primitive man," to "a primitive relation to death under the sign of a partition" (6), whereby, while denying or repressing his own death, primitive man, as soon as he derived benefit from it, could annihilate the life of another. Such is "Freud's great lesson," Crépon writes: if humanity has always posited a distinction, a partition, between those whose death (my own or that of my loved ones) counts as a grievable death, and those whose death does not affect me, is not death per se, then ethics and politics have "no other object than the becoming or destiny of this distinction" (7). Seeking some altogether other link between, and understanding of, ethics and politics and the relation between the two, Crépon considers, in subsequent chapters, responses to Heidegger's Being-toward-death by a number of poets and other writers, mainly Sartre, Levinas, Patočka, Ricoeur, and Derrida.

The first chapter offers Crépon's own response to the question whether Heidegger's analytic forecloses the political, excludes any kind of political community by confining authentic Being-toward-death to Dasein's solitude. It would seem so, as all modes of sharing death belong, for Heidegger, to everydayness, thus to fallenness. In his brief but painstaking reading of Heidegger, however, Crépon locates a wartime thought of shared "being-against death" that does not oppose, but might transform Being-toward-death in opening the possibility for a different kind of politics (23). "It may even be the case," he writes, "that all politics (the 'best' as well as the 'worst') has its origin in the conversion of the Being-toward death of a multiplicity of singularities into a being-against-death that is shared." Moreover, he suggests, this is "the path" that Sartre, Levinas, Patočka, Ricoeur, Derrida, and others explored in their "difficult inheritance of Heidegger's text," always "under the cloud of war in the twentieth century" (25).

Crépon's is not a large book, and its chapters are not lengthy, which means that the careful, critical detail he consistently provides is quite remarkable. In but a few pages, for instance, he offers a convincing analysis of Sartre's restoration of a political dimension to our thinking of death, primarily through the his Being and Nothingness and its "overturning" of Being and Time. With Sartre, as Crépon reads him, Heidegger's Being-toward-death is displaced by the possibility of "dying for," and Dasein's radical solitude in the face of Being-toward-death is set aside in favor of "being-for-others."

In the case of Levinas, the torment that distinguishes World War II from all others, "the torment of mass murder, the assassinations, the untold executions, and, more extraordinarily, the deportation and extermination of the Jews of Europe" (43), leads, again and again, to an analysis of, and opposition to, Heidegger's thesis on death, his reduction of "our relation to death to our unshareable and non-substitutable anxiety before nothingness" (44). Levinas takes issue with Heidegger's thought of death as a power, a capacity that is mine; with the exclusive privilege Heidegger accords to anxiety; and with his portrayal of authentic Being-toward-death as virility. But above all, Crépon suggests, Levinas opposes Heidegger's abstracting of Being-toward-death from any relation toward others. The latter point is crucial, informing as it does Crépon's critique of individualism and of an "ethics" that is centered in the subject, the "I" or the "me," rather than in responsibility to the other -- including responsibility to the death of others. In Levinas he finds the thought of such responsibility, the idea that "the death of the other comes before my own. I am first and foremost responsible for the death of the other" (60). And as Crépon adds in his reading of Patočka, this "other" cannot be delimited by, or reduced to, any affiliation, profession, class, party, nation, or civilization (77).

As he moves through his discussions of Ricoeur, Malraux, and others, Crépon focuses increasingly on the priority of, and first responsibility to, the other, nowhere more eloquently or more convincingly than in his chapter on Derrida's engagement with Heidegger (also with Freud and Levinas) on the question of death. It is here, really the culminating chapter of his book, that Crépon offers his most concerted analysis and critique of the kind of "ethics" that prevails today: ethics as a discourse grounded in a so-called autonomous and sovereign subject or self, an "I" whose relation to others (living and dead) affects it only outwardly and secondarily. For Derrida, on the contrary, Crépon submits, the "I" exists only in relation to others, a relation that is marked by mourning: a mourning that is originary in that it is there from before the start, and impossible in that it affirms always to retain the memory of the other. The other to whom memory responds, like the other to whom, Derrida says, hospitality extends, is "hyperbolic," not limited to race, sex, species, nationality, family or friends; an other who, contra Freud, can never be fully interiorized. In Derrida's thought then, Crépon points out, originary mourning and unconditional hospitality are inseparable, each opening to "the infinity of the other" (112). As he puts it, "'Ethics itself' is both mourning and hospitality" (112).

In Crépon's reading of Derrida on mourning and hospitality, "ethics itself" is far removed from today's utilitarian and rights-based approaches that assign moral worth by calculating the extent to which the other is, or is not, "like me." Ethics cannot be thought as a "first-person" discourse any more than death can be thought as one's ownmost power or capacity. In both cases, for Derrida and certainly for Crépon, the first principle is "to receive," and the first gesture, apart from all knowledge, identification and calculation, is one of welcoming and remembering the other, its vulnerability and mortality. Such responsibility is both ethical and political, Crépon maintains in a discussion, disappointing only for its brevity, that turns on the mortality of the other, "this mortality that politics can never disregard" (117), haunted as it must be by the memory of twentieth century wars. If politics can be deduced from ethics, "that deduction depends, first and foremost, on a radical transformation in our relation to the mortality of the other. Death cannot be thought, calculated, or accepted (assuming it has not been decided or even caused), in the ignorance of what death means each time singularly. Death, in other words, cannot be reduced to an element in some other computation" (119).

This is a tall order given that, as Crépon concedes, politics is the realm of determinations, calculations, quantifications and self-interested strategies, and given that its accounting of deaths -- of others rather than its own -- takes the form of nameless numbers, the singularity of lives thereby being lost. Nonetheless, Crépon's word peace is important here. The "overflow, the flow of ethics into and over [dans et sur] politics," reminds us, he says, that any peace that is indifferent to the other, "that turns its back on the mortality and vulnerability of the (determinate or indeterminate) other," or "that would accommodate itself to the death of the other, whether probable, certain, or programmed, is not peace" (120).