The Three Stigmata of Friedrich Nietzsche: Political Physiology in the Age of Nihilism

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Nandita Biswas Mellamphy, The Three Stigmata of Friedrich Nietzsche: Political Physiology in the Age of Nihilism, Palgrave Macmillan, 2011, 157pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230282551.

Reviewed by Tom Stern, University College London


Mellamphy's book aims to draw together three strands of Nietzsche's thought: his 'great politics', his philosopher of the future and the eternal recurrence. Her claim is that they are 'always co-extensive and mutually implicated' (x); hence, a reference by Nietzsche to one of these concepts necessarily invokes the others. The future philosopher is 'undoubtedly a political figure' (with artistic features) (15); and, for the future philosopher, the experience of the eternal recurrence is central to the 'task of establishing 'great politics'' (41). It is the emphasis on Nietzsche's 're-articulation of the 'political'' (121) which is most prominent, though, as stated, Mellamphy takes the three concepts together.

First, then, a word about Nietzsche and politics. There has been a great deal of discussion about whether Nietzsche can helpfully be considered a 'political' thinker. To a certain extent, predictably, this depends on one's definition of 'political'. Despite occasional, scattered remarks, Nietzsche wasn't interested in theories of resource distribution, and he often suggests that getting too excited about 'the state' is a poor substitute for getting too excited about God. In that sense, he was not political. Then again, Nietzsche often takes pride of place in classes on the history of political thought: he is very interested in the social structures of large groups of humans, the ideas those groups develop and the interaction between the two. What could be more political than that? Finally, Nietzsche sometimes suggests that being unlike those around you is valuable per se. This has implications for any constructive political view one would take him to have. It's one thing not to express a strong preference for any particular mode of government; it's another to suggest, as at least Zarathustra does, that you're just better off in the mountains than you are with the masses in the valley. It is this kind of thinking that earns Nietzsche the title of 'anti-political': it suggests not merely a lack of interest in politics, but something further -- a disdain for all collective human activity.

This last 'anti-political' stance is complicated by a further element of Nietzsche's thought. Individuals, for him, are not born fully formed, ready to reject their social environments or to embrace them. That's because, first, what we think of as individuals are better understood as bundles of drives, instincts and forces, which can work with or against each other. Second, we are socially formed, at least to a very great extent; so the rejection of your context, like its acceptance, is a function of that context. Historical and social influence are located in the way we think, but also in our physiology: we are to understand the resentment felt by slaves to their masters not merely in terms of hating being told what to do, but also in terms of being sicker, weaker and smaller. When Nietzsche says that Christianity is a 'disease', it's a metaphor, but it also happened.

It is in this context that Mellamphy's concept of 'political physiology', which she describes as a 'perspective' employed in the book, comes in. What might otherwise sound like a contradiction in terms -- physiology as innate and individual, politics as social and environmental -- has the potential to be applied to Nietzsche's work in a very interesting way, uniting the three accounts of his politics. Drawing attention to this is helpful. However, confusion remains about whether, for Mellamphy, the claim is that politics is best understood as psychological and physiological or whether, as the primacy given to 'political physiology' suggests, psychology somehow reduces to physiology. Even if the common-sense psychology/physiology distinction is somehow misguided, an explanation would be helpful. We are told, for example, that 'all 'morality' and social valuation is at bottom an expression and interpretation of bodily states' and also that 'the 'self-conscious' agent is nothing other than [a] fluctuating temporary concretion of instincts.' (25) Are instincts bodily states? Mellamphy's discussion is characterised by a very liberal use of the term 'physiology': Nietzsche's claim that 'Pre-Platonic philosophers' were 'formal incarnations of Philosophia' does not obviously qualify as a remark about physiology (cf. p. 26). However, Nietzsche's own views on the distinction between physiology and psychology are hardly unproblematic.

More troubling than the notion of 'political physiology' is what Mellamphy terms 'Nietzsche's concept of 'great politics'' (ix). Mellamphy takes her book to be of central significance precisely because it is able to explain this concept (ix, xix, 25). She speaks, for example, of the 'task of great politics' (6), of 'the materialisation of 'great politics'' in the context of the 'philosopher's experience of Dionysian multiplicity' (13, 41), and of 'the restricted economy of the nomothetic pyramid of great politics' (15). As we move through the book, 'great politics' becomes 'the name for the cultivation of the Overhuman functionality of will to power within present configurations of existence' (19, similarly 95).

However, in contrast to the book's other two 'crucial concepts' -- eternal recurrence and the future philosopher -- 'great politics' is unusual in that plenty of Nietzsche scholars could be forgiven for thinking that he didn't have such a concept at all, at least if this is taken to mean an independent idea which is connected with his philosophy and which, to some minimal degree, he worked out and articulated (to such a degree, for example, that there is a Nietzschean 'task of 'great politics''). In the case of the eternal recurrence, the writings in which Nietzsche explicitly introduces it are well known -- even if there is debate about what they mean. The same may be said for the philosopher of the future. Not so for 'great politics'.

Thus, to avoid a fool's errand, one might expect (and one does not find) some attempt to establish that Nietzsche has this concept, prior to investigating what it is. In fact, despite the announcement that it is one of Nietzsche's three 'crucial' concepts, Mellamphy does not actually quote a single, full sentence of Nietzsche -- not one -- in which he uses the term 'great politics'. She does, on one occasion, quote extensively from a section of Beyond Good and Evil (BGE) in which, in a passage she does not quote, Nietzsche uses the term. I'll begin there.

Nietzsche ends BGE 208 with the announcement that 'the time for small politics is over: the very next century will bring the struggle for the world-domination -- the compulsion to great politics' (my translation). There is much in BGE 208 that is open to interpretation. But the context of this last remark is clear -- clear to anyone who reads BGE 208 with the intention of trying to understand what Nietzsche is saying. It is a discussion of two (for Nietzsche) related features of contemporary Europe: first, the (perceived) sudden mixture of races and classes that had until then been kept apart; second, the relationship between Europe and Russia. Subject to Nietzsche's favourite caveat -- that every simplification is a falsification -- a reasonable summary of what he says is as follows: the sudden mixing of classes and races evident throughout Europe has led to paralysis of the will and consequent weakness; because Europe is weak, there is a concern that Russia, which has the potential for extraordinary unity and strength of will, will dominate Europe. If Europe is to survive, it has two options: either Europe must make Russia as weak as Europe (i.e., by dividing it into smaller units and enforcing parliamentarianism), or Europe must become as strong and unified as Russia has the potential to be. Nietzsche labels the former option 'small politics' (or 'petty politics', 'kleine Politik') and the latter he calls 'great politics' ('grosse Politik'). He prefers the latter option; hence the remark quoted above.

Two points about what Nietzsche says are quite striking. The first is that he is talking about 'great politics' as a pan-European movement to combat the threat of Russia. He is not (here) engaged in political ontology, political physiology, toxicology, or nomothetic activity (all ascribed to him at various points by Mellamphy). He is expressing a very standard late nineteenth-century fear that Russia would grow stronger and Europe would grow weaker. The second point is that Nietzsche was not immune to another late nineteenth-century thought: races are relatively independent, self-standing things and there is cultural and political significance in 'mixing' them. Now is not the time to go into these views: for good reasons, the latter has died a welcome death; the former, in contrast, is in robust health. But a book devoted to Nietzsche's 'great politics' is the place to explore them.

In Mellamphy's presentation of BGE 208, however, there is no mention of Russia, no mention of Nietzsche's awkward treatment of race. The section which she cites from BGE 208 is heavily edited such that all comments relating to these topics are deleted (xix). Normally these omissions are indicated with the standard, scholarly ellipsis, but sometimes, it must be said, they are not. Thus her citation begins with 'In the new generation', without saying anything about in what respect the generation is new. In context, it is 'new' in the sense that it occurs once 'races or classes that have long been separated are crossed suddenly and decisively.' Worth noting, too, is that Mellamphy uses the Kaufmann translation, which renders 'Geschlecht' as 'generation'; the former has a biological ring to it (significant in the context of a discussion of mixing races) which, to my mind, is lacking in the latter. What's more, Kaufmann (very sensibly) translates 'grosse Politik' at the end of BGE 208 as 'large-scale politics', not 'great politics'. (Mellamphy barely discusses issues of translation.) In sum, there is nothing in BGE 208 to suggest that Nietzsche had a concept of 'great politics' beyond the need for Europe to pull together against Russia; and Mellamphy edits out all the Nietzsche quotations which would enable her reader to grasp that this could possibly be what he meant.

On another occasion, Mellamphy references Twilight of the Idols (VIII 4) in support of Nietzsche's alleged rejection of 'politics' in favour of 'great politics' (21). Again, the context is revealing. Nietzsche does mention 'grosse Politik' in this section (Hollingdale, Mellamphy's preferred translator, has 'grand politics'). But suspicion might be aroused by the previous section, in which Nietzsche writes that 'great politics fools nobody'. In fact, here as most often, Nietzsche clearly has something else in mind with 'great politics' -- or, more accurately, someone: Bismarck, and his obsession with foreign policy. Hence the reference, in conjunction with 'great politics', to 'blood and iron' (BGE 254), to the 'statesman' (BGE 241), to 'the new Reich' (Twilight V 3, similarlyTwilight VIII 4), to the 'emergence of a people' and consequent 'fear of other states for the new colossus' (Human, All too Human, 481). (Bismarck may well be relevant to BGE 208, but we cannot discuss this here.) To read these passages is to realise not only that 'grosse Politik' is connected with Bismarck, but also that Nietzsche is capable of treating this Bismarckian 'great politics' with deep suspicion (see Human 481, entitled 'Great politics and its costs'). Mellamphy does not discuss these passages; nor does she mention Bismarck. One can, of course, write a book about Nietzsche without discussing Bismarck. What one can't do is write a book claiming that Nietzsche's concept of 'great politics' is crucial to his entire way of thinking, without mentioning that Nietzsche (often) associates that term with someone else, arguably the most powerful man in the world, and that Nietzsche is (in places) highly critical of the concept. The connection between Bismarck and 'great politics' is not controversial and I am hardly the first to point it out.[1]

Reading Mellamphy's book, one gets no sense of this. She will go as far as to admit that Nietzsche doesn't define 'great politics' (which is misleading, in as much as it's often obvious, in context, what he's talking about); but she goes on to tell us immediately that 'we must assume, at the minimum, that it must necessarily involve the philosopher-physiologist's diagnostic activity of symptomatology.' (43) This is supported with a quotation from The Gay Science (Preface, 2) in which there is no mention of 'grosse Politik'. In light of previous remarks, the force of this 'must necessarily' is not overwhelming.

When she does discuss 'great politics', Mellamphy tends to give references to Nietzsche quotations, which she treats much as she treats BGE 208. She writes:

the objective or end of this structural economy [of 'great politics'] is ultimately to uphold and privilege the philosopher's experience of unrestricted expenditure, the general economy of Dionysian nature. This is why Nietzsche will claim in Beyond Good and Evil that 'society does not exist for society's sake but only as the foundation and scaffolding on which a choice type is able to raise itself to its higher task and to its higher state of being.' (48)

As before, the reader of BGE 258 (in full) will see that it has been heavily edited to remove the original context: this isn't a view which Nietzsche is straightforwardly dictating to us, nor is it obviously connected with 'Dionysian nature'. Rather, it's a view which he thinks aristocrats ought to cling to if they are to avoid participating in their own destruction (as Nietzsche thinks, in the French Revolution, they did). As with BGE 208, there's lots to say about Nietzsche's account of how aristocrats should think of themselves (also a pressing late nineteenth-century European concern, along with Russia, race, and Bismarck); and as before, Mellamphy simply edits it out to present a general, context-free account of Nietzschean 'great politics', a phrase which is not mentioned in BGE 258 (but is mentioned four aphorisms earlier in relation to Bismarck). It's possible to edit quotations while retaining the sense (or explaining it in your own words); but that is not what Mellamphy is doing in these representative examples.

Mellamphy's book intends to unite the German, French and Anglo-American strands of Nietzsche scholarship. At the least, it will be very unlikely to succeed as regards the last of these. As some of the quotations may have indicated, the writing is extremely dense and inhospitable. In as much as an 'introduction' is meant to welcome its reader to the subject matter, her choice of title -- 'The Mnemotechnics of Nihilism and the Political Physiology of Eternal Recurrence' -- is representatively ill-judged. The Anglo-American tradition, whatever its considerable advantages and disadvantages, is one in which this kind of prose is at most reluctantly condoned. Readers approaching Mellamphy's book from this tradition will find her style frustrating. What frustrated this reader the most, however, is that she doesn't appear to be interested in what Nietzsche was saying.

[1] See, e.g., Robert Holub, 'Nietzsche's Colonialist Imagination' in Friedrichsmeyer, Lennox, Zantop (eds.), The imperialist imagination: German colonialism and its legacy. (University of Michigan Press, 1998)