The Time of Revolution: Kairos and Chronos in Heidegger

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Felix Ó Murchadha, The Time of Revolution: Kairos and Chronos in Heidegger, Bloomsbury, 2013, 256pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441102461.

Reviewed by Christopher Yates, Grove City College


English-speaking scholars will be grateful for this revised translation of Ó Murchadha's important study, Zeit des Handelns und Möglichkeit der Verwandlung (Königshausen und Neumann Verlag1999). Echoing its subject-matter, the text is a repetition in which new accents and sections carry the possibilities of the original forward into broadening engagements with Heidegger's work on the transformational character of time. The result is a book that should interest not only Heideggerians, but also philosophers of time, history, aesthetics, natality, and revolutionary action.

Ó Murchadha believes that "to think revolution is to think the possibility of radical, abrupt, sudden and transforming change, or rather to think such change as possibility" (157). For the most part Heidegger's thought, he argues, not only fits these parameters but also enables us to formulate them. Throughout his work on fundamental ontology, the history of being, and the essence of truth in relation to artistic and political work, one "constant motif" in Heidegger's thinking is "that of transformation, of the sudden and free emergence of a new order of entities, of origins and abrupt beginnings" (158). Charting this preoccupation is a task that requires the kind of dense textual accounting that pairs close exegesis with critical commentary. Readers will need stamina, and Ó Murchadha's style sometimes displays the taxing habit of running numerous Heideggerian currencies together in the economy of a single paragraph. But such challenges are a testament, ultimately, to the high quality of workmanship in a project rare for its ability to think from, with, and even against Heidegger in the interest of a theme few scholars dare to distill.

Fundamental to the project's thesis is the Heideggerian insight that time as we normally understand it -- as a configuration or unit of measure -- is but the quantitative surface of a more qualitative depth. Interrupting the chronos of continuity and order there is the kairos of 'initiating' (anfängliche) time, the action-oriented moment of vision (Augenblick) that irrupts into temporal constitution and inspires our expectations and decisions anew. To understand how the temporal and revolutionary relate, one must join Ó Murchadha in taking the genitival ('time of revolution') and prepositional ('split in time') cues very seriously. The meaning of this interplay between chronos and kairos is understood "from the experience of acting" (3), and there according to "the dynamic interrelation of praxis and poiesis" (5). This second pairing distills the first and specifies how time emerges in and through the orders of doing (praxis -- kairological) and making (poiesis -- chronological). Transformation, thus understood, happens both in the temporal plane of our everyday actions and in the more intensified occurrences through which the history of being moves and means. Chronos and its measures are necessary, but of primary interest to Ó Murchadha are those 'between' moments that herald "the kairological situation of revolutionary action" (15).

The first task is to appreciate the priority of possibility in Dasein "as an agent in and through time" whose existential modalities disclose "the practical constitution of temporality" (131-32). Such is the broader ambition of chapter one, where a study of fundamental ontology establishes important indicators for the theme of revolutionary transformation. Here Ó Murchadha focuses on Heidegger's account of authentic time in Being and Time's alternating, and (he argues) ambiguously related, studies of temporality and historicity. Following Heidegger, he stresses how Dasein's being consists 'in' possibility understood as a moment or field of 'occurrence' (Geschehen). Dasein is not 'in' anything like objective time but rather "relates to itself as possibility because it is temporal" (26). The traction of Dasein's understanding (Verstehen) lies in its future-directedness, in which case temporality always already entails a kairological wager of openness and novelty, change and rupture, discontinuity amid continuity. But Dasein's being in the 'present' occurs on the basis of having a heritage that "comes from the past" and an order of 'having-been' possibilities (32).

The observation is important insofar as Ó Murchadha wants to ascribe Heidegger's failed attempt to found historicity on the temporality of Dasein to a mismanagement of what the kairological ontology should have suggested. Read backwards from the historicity sections, one sees how matters in Being and Time such as birth, generation and fate actually suggest that a kairological "order without ground" (36) necessarily shapes Dasein's temporality and futuricity across a modal course of 'repetitions.' Provided one understands historicity "in terms of a concept of action" and Dasein in terms of its "way of being toward the new" (38-39), a kairological link shows itself between historicity and authentic temporality. Penetrating discussions of resoluteness, care, and angst justify this reading. Ó Murchadha's point is not that temporality 'follows' history, but that the two have "an interplay of unity and difference" (47), which Heidegger intimated on one hand and overlooked on the other. Rightly understood, reclaiming the 'there' of its being in the terms of its own question of being requires Dasein to undergo a transformation of meaning that responds to a history of "the possibilities of the having-been" (49) as well as the futural order of its being-with engagements.

Chapter two remains with Being and Time for the sake of clarifying the praxis-poiesis comparison through which the role of kairos must also be understood. Here Ó Murchadha is more straightforward with his heuristic: being-in-the-world is fundamentally relational, and is conditioned by a kairological manner of 'doing' (praxis) and a chronological manner of 'making' (poiesis). One might wonder how the difference between praxis and poiesis can be imagined without some precipitating 'configuration' of their relation, but it is hard to see how such a worry would impair the fruitfulness of Ó Murchadha's distinction. He shows both modes to be structural and thus necessary, but the side of praxis is clearly more pertinent as a resource for disclosing the propensity for the "radically new" (51).

In its dealings with the practical 'equipment' of life, Dasein's in-order-to (um-zu) structure of purposeful relations is a mode irreducible to notions of objective presence or strict practice-theory divisions. Heidegger's conception of 'handiness' (Zuhandenheit) reveals an order "prior to the ordered" (57). Hard as it may be to glean anything new from Heidegger's 'hammer' example, Ó Murchadha does well to observe that the break of the hammer, as a rupture (Bruch) "in the context of reference" (59) effectively signals a disturbance of the chronological 'now' that houses the shoemaker's order of concern: "Here, we encounter a kairological moment. In relation to a handy entity, in relation thus to poiesis, we can reach a moment in which a rupture occurs, a moment which cannot be calculated in advance" (59). The disruption in the referential order of circumspection infuses the poietical (making) relations and their work-world chronos with an uncanny anxiety. As with the interplay of temporality and historicity, a 'having-been' presents itself and burdens Dasein's forward-moving possibilities with a responsibility for its past understanding. In Heidegger's analysis of being-towards-death, the accent on utmost possibility would also seem to invite a more praxical understanding of temporality to help accomplish Dasein's understanding of itself (68). According to Ó Murchadha, however, Heidegger meets these provocative interruptions of chronos/making only to double-back and specify Dasein's transcendence in the terms of a continued poietical individuation.

What these and other phenomena suggest is that Heidegger was either unwilling or unable to embrace fully those praxical and kairological elements braided to the being-towards structure of Dasein's self-understanding. The concern may be new to many commentators. But its warrant increases when one reexamines the ecstatic makeup of Dasein's fundamental care (Sorge) structure. Care happens, Ó Murchadha explains, at the intersection of Dasein's futuricity, having-been, and present modi of possibilities. Here there is a "movement," a "way of openness" constituting temporality as the dynamic site in which relations are made possible (70). The awakening must be understood kairologically, for authentic temporality is not produced in any poietic sense. Dasein comes to itself in the groundless being of a moving moment, one that carries it ahead of itself into a new order that demands a response of "authentic action, praxis" (72).[1]

Illuminating as they are, these discussions can only gesture through the kairological and praxical components of time toward the governing theme of 'revolution.' It is not until chapter three's treatment of freedom that we begin to glimpse the larger significance of the time of action as a moment of 'emergence' and revolutionary 'truth.' Freedom already pertains to Dasein's rejoinder (Erwiderung) concerning its relations to the strange truths of the having-been. Ó Murchadha now traces Heidegger's transition (after Being and Time) toward thinking freedom on the basis of an 'intensity' that stands otherwise to Aristotelian or Kantian conceptions of 'ground.' Intensity names the character of 'occurrence' (Geschehen) as Dasein moves through the interruption that is kairos. Freedom concerns the will and its structure of repetition amid possibilities, but it is more precisely understood as the disclosure of the play of possibility and action hitherto "hidden and distorted in chronology" (98). To say, with Heidegger, that human beings belong to freedom is to say they belong to a movement of unconcealment that looks very much like Heidegger's deepening conception of truth as aletheia. It is in this kairological vein of exposed groundlessness that Ó Murchadha speaks of "the truth of a revolutionary time" (98).

Whether Heidegger understands freedom as the "freedom-to-ground" ("On the Essence of Grounds") or as "the essence of truth" itself ("The Essence of Freedom"), Ó Murchadha holds that he is struggling to think ground and truth kairologically (102). The very freedom to speak in terms of truth's 'correctness' is itself won from a liberating "kairological occurrence" (108). The order of propositional truths may 'discover' entities, but at the same time it draws boundaries beyond which lie traces of the unfamiliar. Time and truth, then, are of the same revolutionary makeup insofar as they are experienced with all the intensity of meeting "a way to chaos and at the same time a strict order" (110). The task of revolutionary transformations thus concerns how the responsive 'grounding' of a new order in time and truth can 'preserve' the liberating unconcealment in a way that 'measures' temporality in terms of "essential action" (112).

As is well known, Heidegger's focus through the 1930s also involves a puzzling shift of emphasis. He no longer privileges Dasein as the primary locus of transformative possibilities, but focuses instead on the history of being and the question of grounds in the work of art. The focus also carries him toward an ultimately troubling emphasis on the work of political destiny. It takes skill and courage to work out the theme of revolutionary time in texts from this period. Ó Murchadha displays both in his final two chapters.

Part of the challenge is that the terms and distinctions that have advanced the rubric of revolutionary time undergo some alterations. Heidegger's conceptual apparatus becomes harder to align with the kairos-praxis and chronos-poiesis pairings. Namely, and with respect first to the issue of art and poetry, one must hear a change of valence in the notion of work (Werk) and the implications of this for poiesis, actuality, and action. These elements must now be understood more perspicuously in terms of Heidegger's orientation from "the happening of the ontological difference" rather than the phenomena of Dasein's disclosedness (123). Situated thus, he explores how artworks carry the course of unconcealment to a precise sense of "a setting-in-work of truth," and he simultaneously specifies action in terms of "preservation" (125). "The order of truth of this happening of difference," Ó Murchadha explains, "can no longer be thought from Dasein, but rather as an order which sets Dasein into the possibility of truth. Heidegger thinks this order as the order of the work" (126). The kairological issue of possibility, hitherto attached to Dasein, shifts to the happening of being in the artistic work but there gathers Dasein into this movement anew. What then to make of praxis?

Ó Murchadha believes the shift in fact spurs a deeper account of possible creation, transformation, and freedom in the face of abyssal grounds. One indication is that the artwork's strife between earth and world involves a historical having-been as well as a futural opening, much the same as was noted in the case of Dasein's thrownness and historicity. The work of a painting or a Greek temple brings this tension to stand in an apparent actuality, but remains kairological; it preserves the "rift" as a site of "beginning" (Anfang) and characterizes action as "the constant attempt to reach back to the origin disclosed in the work" (142-43). I am not persuaded one can apply the 'having-been' element so readily to Heidegger's thinking in this regard, but I take Ó Murchadha's point that artistic works do not exhaust the possibilities that produce them. Something indeed "remains inappropriable for human poiesis" (145).[2] Works of art are "a free relation, a free response" (148) to such disclosure and withdrawal in the history of being, and they show or sound "the possibility of . . . a new order of experience" (150). Their 'actuality' in effect serves or 'promises' the resilience of possibility for human action, now more forcibly under the rubric of occurrence.[3] The resulting challenge for revolutionary action, however, is to 'think' in such a way that does not lose the trace of kairos in the chronos that ensues.

To pass from the revolutionary time of the work of art to the work of political action, especially in the Heidegger of 1933-34, may appear like a concluding effort to preserve the philosophical merits of the theme from the biographical disappointments. But Ó Murchadha's discussion in chapter five is neither conciliatory amendment nor artificial division of thought from praxis. Superbly treating the missteps evident in the Rectoral Address and the related tragedy of Heidegger's Nazi affiliation, his argumentation moves according to three fronts. First, Ó Murchadha stresses how Heidegger continues to understand revolution as that genuine relation to beginnings that opens up in the experience of time. Revolution is not that which occurs when an older order proves decadent or exhausted, but is rather a moment of repetition that destructures history, liberates us toward the freedom of a coming new order, and bewilders the configurations of knowledge understood as technē (160).[4] Second, the uniqueness of such a kairological moment bears, for Heidegger, on the character of a people (Volk), and so on the decision and destiny of a historical 'we' exercising the vocation of a common polis. The association is problematic, Ó Murchadha observes, because the elemental "decision to join together in a historical mission" assumes a Platonic pedigree. Heidegger's German-Greek bias is there, to be sure, but there in the manner of a 'spiritual' bond that privileges the "singularity of a people" in the space of the polis and in the history of being (162). Insofar as it is up to 'thinkers,' especially, to steward this work of transformative truth and ontological destiny, philosophy purports to guide the polis in the vein of a poietic technē. This necessity may be acceptable in terms of the primacy of possibility in the poetic vocation of abyssal founding, but it suggests a problematic "rethinking [of] the relation between praxis and poiesis in relation to the 'work'" (169).

The third issue specifies this problem in terms of its outcome. Heidegger has linked historical identity 'in' the moment of revolution to the creative technē of the thinker, poet, and statesman. The view allows poietical making to supervene on kairological time. Revolutionary knowing and acting then relate less to the possibility structure of work, and more to the setting-in-work of actualization. Uncertainty, unknowing, and the quest for a newly ordered work are of course earmarks of the revolutionary situation, but Heidegger seems to waver between "philosophy as questioning and philosophy as thought-work (Denkwerk)," ultimately inclining toward the immanentism of "the state as work" (173-74). Ó Murchadha thus holds that the ideas of the Rectoral Address reveal "a failure of nerve on Heidegger's part" (173). His philosophical sense of a German 'we' fated to carry the question of being met with the problem of political decline and destiny, and there morphed into a decision for the ontic and voluntaristic political work proffered by Hitler and National Socialism. Failing to hold the chronos and kairos of his time in reflective tension, his decision was for the power of the actual and determinate in lieu of the power of the possible and the otherwise.

In the balance of things, Ó Murchadha's Heidegger remains deeply instructive about the time of revolution and the sense of obligation that must attend such moments. He faltered profoundly in applying such obligations, but the spirit of his philosophy allows Ó Murchadha to conceive of revolution as a moment of decision -- "one which renews a commitment to others, a commitment to a shared chronology, but one which is not unquestioned, but precisely is up for question in the kairos" (191). The book is faithful to the better resources of Heidegger's thinking but also careful to solicit a broader conversation as we move forward in service to its compelling theme. So doing, there is at least one element of kairological possibilities that Ó Murchadha is not able to thematize in this study, but that merits consideration. For much of the Western tradition, and with mixed merit, the inbreaking of kairos envisions a new order of grace. Grace does not seem a thing to be 'made' per se, but rather received, preserved, and shared in praxis. One wonders whether our thinking, poetizing, and even political 'work' might also experience and respond to the 'moments of vision' with a revolutionary grace?

[1] The poiesis of the work-world lacks such moments, but the moment in which an "order collapses" (74) is the moment when the primacy of the praxical, intersubjective world shows itself.

[2] Ó Murchadha's point seems to involve the following parallel: Just as Dasein was summoned to respond to its historicity of having-been, the "fundamental mood" of poetry consists in a rejoinder or response to the having-been (ge-wesen) of the gods in their play of absence and presence (147).

[3] The time 'of' the work of art brings kairos to stand 'in' the work and opens up "the possibility of its preservation" (156).

[4] Revolution occurs as a split from narrative time and an encounter with the peculiar responsiveness emerging before "that which originates thought" (160).