The Tomb of the Artisan God: On Plato's Timaeus

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Serge Margel, The Tomb of the Artisan God: On Plato's Timaeus, Philippe Lynes (tr.), University of Minnesota Press, 2019, 146pp., $20.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781517906429.

Reviewed by Annie Larivée, Carleton University


Despite the complexity of its content and purpose, Serge Margel's book proceeds from one central intuition: that the demiurge in Plato's Timaeus, regardless of the excellence of his skills and aims, is a powerless god. The volume was originally published twenty-five years ago. Philippe Lynes's translation has an addition and a notable omission. While the addition is rather inconsequential -- a three-page preface in which Margel situates this his first book in the context of his subsequent work -- the omission is not. The original French version had a long introduction, "Avances", by Derrida, which has been omitted.[1] The question arises: can Margel's book stand on its own, or is its meaning tied to a symbiotic relationship with Derrida's text? Is the book addressed to the adepts of déconstruction, or is it a commentary on the Timaeus likely to interest historians of ancient philosophy, Plato scholars in particular? It may be useful to begin by addressing such questions.

Margel seldom mentions Derrida, but his influence on Margel's book is undeniable. While Derrida's best-known text on Plato is probably La Pharmacie de Platon (1968), Khôra (1993) is the most relevant, here. Khôra deals with what is commonly referred to as 'the receptacle' in Plato's Timaeus, a mysterious third dimension distinct from intelligible forms and sensible objects to which Margel dedicates a whole chapter. Despite exploring common territory, Derrida's Khôra and Margel's book are dissimilar in many regards.

Margel's book is not written à la manière de Derrida. While it suffers from a lack of clarity, that is not due to an original use of language. The prose is relatively sober and the language-work that characterizes déconstruction does not play a major role in the text. The translation is generally accurate; this is not the type of book that is significantly altered by a good translation. Something is always lost in translation, however. A good example can be found in the book's title. Although 'tombeau' obviously means 'tomb', it can also designate an artistic genre in French. Musicians have created musical 'tombeaux' (e.g., Fauré's Le Tombeau de Ravel). And there are poetic 'tombeaux' such as Mallarmé's Le Tombeau d'Edgar Poe. Since Margel does not discuss this meaning, it is not easy to decide if he intended the double entendre. Regardless, the ambiguity exists and opens fertile interpretive possibilities absent in the English title.

In contrast to most scholarly work produced about ancient philosophy, the title suggests Margel's book falls more on the creative than the explanatory side of the hermeneutic spectrum. Its short length is likely to reinforce that expectation. Anyone familiar with the secondary literature on Plato will be surprised, at first, by the book's brevity. One might wonder if Margel uses the Timaeus solely as a support for the type of broad reflections on the 'history of metaphysics' that Derrida, in the wake of Heidegger, was fond of.

Although the book doesn't have some features expected in a 'serious' scholarly interpretation (there is no index locorum, no index rerum or nominum, and no bibliography), it does share important features with traditional commentaries. In fact, it is unlikely to be of interest to non-Plato specialists. Much of its content presupposes a familiarity with the Timaeus as a whole, the problems raised by some of its most disputed passages, and its scientific elements (physics, astronomy, biology, and geometric chemistry). Readers unfamiliar with at least some of the secondary literature on the Timaeus will have difficulty appreciating the singularity of Margel's reading or assessing its place in the wider hermeneutic landscape. Margel does not critically engage with alternative interpretations, and his long, erudite footnotes can't compensate for such a lack of familiarity. They mainly refer to sources and provide additional information on elements in the main text.

Margel doesn't attempt to offer a comprehensive account of the Timaeus. He doesn't consider important sections and aspects of the dialogue (e.g., the prologue, the narrative context in which Timaeus' cosmogonic account is embedded, the characters, the connection between the Timaeus and other dialogues of the platonic corpus), and in some cases, blatantly ignores them.[2] It is tempting to classify his book as a thematic commentary, but that wouldn't be accurate since he doesn't intend to give a detailed account of one specific aspect of the dialogue. Thus, it would be incorrect to describe this as a commentary on the figure of the demiurge. Rather, Margel starts with an (unorthodox) intuition concerning the demiurge -- namely, his finitude and powerlessness -- and then strategically explores certain elements of Timaeus's cosmogonic narrative which he thinks illustrate and support his daring hypothesis. We could categorize it as a commentary à thèse.

Let me expand on Margel's thèse, or "hypothesis". To make his interpretation appear as credible as possible, I only mentioned that his book offers a picture of the demiurge as a powerless god. Although bold and unusual, this characterization of Margel's thesis ignores the most curious part of his 'vision'. Indeed, the adjectives Margel uses are more hyperbolic and the story he proposes weirder. On his reading, the demiurge is fundamentally désoeuvré (idle, unproductive, inactive) and impuissant (impotent, helpless, powerless). As if this description was not astounding enough, Margel pictures this god as mourant (dying, moribund, passing). In his eerie vision, this dying demiurge guarantees the world's subsistence through a promise (promesse) and a sacrifice, but ultimately, our world is nothing else than the god's own tomb. Hence the book's title:

The world, in the universality of its totality, would have been mimetically produced as a votive object, an object henceforth destined to offering, gift, and sacrifice. This is what we will call the tomb of the artisan god. The world as image would be a sanctuary, a sacred temple, where the ideality of the divine is contemplated at the same time as the demiurge's announced death is indefinitely commemorated . . . The world as sanctuary, the world as the starry heavens, will have been nothing else, in its confused mixture of ideality and flesh, than the momentary actuality of a survival. (5)

Saying that the images of the tomb of a dying god, of a divine promise, of a divine sacrifice, and the allusion to flesh are too reminiscent of Judeo-Christian themes not to be anachronistic would be stating the obvious. But these images also raise the issue of the literal or figurative nature of the demiurge in the Timaeus, a question Margel doesn't discuss. When faced with the suggestive imagery of Margel's hypothesis, the reader finds herself at a crossroad. She can approach it metaphorically and ask what those images symbolize. The idea that the figure of the demiurge is metaphorical is a familiar interpretive position, after all. But in the case of Margel's vision more than of Timaeus' narrative, one wonders: metaphor for what?

I have referred to Margel's hypothesis as a 'vision' since textual evidence to support his portrait of the demiurge is scarce if we limit ourselves to explicit statements made by Timaeus. For the most part, such passages do not exist or do not support the most excessive aspects of Margel's interpretation. By contrast, passages addressing the power, skills, and benevolence of the demiurge, as well as the excellence of his worldly production, are numerous. Margel, who pays little attention to these passages, does not seem to think that they threaten his thesis. Indeed, his interest lies in the tension between the demiurge's productive abilities and authority, and his radical limitations. Hence Margel's presentation of his hypothesis as an attempt to shed light on a "paradox" and an "aporia" in what he sees as diverse figures of the demiurge (1). His concession of doing violence to the text (2) suggests that he is aware of the divergence between his reading and traditional views of the Timaeus.

Considering the close to non-existent textual basis supporting Margel's hypothesis, his 'vision' may appear at worst delirious, at best gratuitous -- not unlike Russell's proverbial flying teapot. But in fact, Margel does give something like an argument, though he proceeds indirectly. He examines certain aspects of Timaeus' cosmogonic account at length and, in light of the implicit features he perceives, makes inferences (he sees as) confirming his views of the demiurge. The observations he offers to support his hypothesis constitute an oblique, circuitous, and at times very laborious demonstration. This method produces a commentary consisting mostly of a paraphrastic description of implicit aspects of the Timaeus, as if Margel were attempting to reveal the unsaid of the text, its non-dit.[3] Because of this indirect approach, his book is only deceptively short. For readers seeking persuasion and understanding, Margel's method turns an apparently brief book into a demanding interpretive odyssey. The text requires rereading. It raises doubts about the quality of one's comprehension and the clarity of Margel's explanations.

That said, Derrida is right to point out in Avances that the core elements of Margel's reading hypothesis are unveiled right from the beginning. In that sense, nothing, or not much, is hidden from the reader: the introduction is the conclusion. What remains less than clear, though, are some of the paths that led Margel to his 'vision' and the exact meaning of the Christic images he relies on.[4] To the best of my understanding, Margel uses the following aspects of Timaeus' narrative to support his depiction of the demiurge as a powerless, dying god.

The first and most serious limitation imposed on the demiurge's power is linked to the fact that he is using pre-existing material. He doesn't create the world from scratch. Margel pays close attention to the pre-teleological physics in the Timaeus. His descriptions of the exact nature of the demiurgic intervention with the four elements (earth, water, air, fire), the khôra, and the elementary triangles are thorough but complex to the point of precariousness. The type of artisanal constraints at stake here do not commit an interpreter to think of the demiurge as a powerless god. True, the god is not all powerful. His actions are constrained by Necessity. This fact is explicitly mentioned in the Timaeus and is entirely uncontroversial. But Margel's thesis is much stronger. His depiction paints the demiurge as an "inoperative god, a powerless and dying god" (2, "un dieu désoeuvré, impuissant et mourant"). What justifies this steep jump from constrained by Necessity to powerless?

Although Margel does not critically discuss his hermeneutic decision, it appears to me that this leap rests on an assumption about the pre-teleological physics of the Timaeus. Margel insists on the distinction between two representations of the world, each corresponding to a specific time. The "cosmic time", initiated by the mimetic intervention of the demiurge, is related to the regular circular motions of the planets and stars. The starry sky is an image of the "omnitemporality"[5] that defines this cosmic time, which results from the "demiurgic or noetic representation of the world" (4). But there is also a time that preceded this demiurgic intervention and in which it remains embedded, so to speak. This linear time is "preliminary to any sensible organization of the world and 'anterior' to any regular or successive order of the planets." It corresponds to "the genetic representation of the world" (4). Now, Margel holds that this linear time is a time of "pure consummation", which is crucial for his interpretation. In his view, this pre-cosmic time entails a slow but steady process of disintegration. This disintegration cannot be eliminated by the intelligent intervention of the demiurge, only neutralized through his "noetic representation". Therefore, Margel writes: "The genetic order of the world would silently suffer from the possibility that the demiurge would no longer be the demiurge, that he become inoperative in his powerlessness to forever guarantee the ideal representation of the world." The world would thus face "the absolute, that is to say irreducible imminence of a risk of decomposition, dissolution, and annihilation." (5)

What justifies this gloomy view? Without providing solid textual evidence, Margel assumes there is something like an incremental but inevitable loss of "kinetic energy" that occurs in the context of the motions and modifications of the primary elements. The demiurge constructs the cosmos from "elements already charged with radiant energy":

these forms of elementary energies, these δυνάμεις ἰσχυρᾶς, would for the demiurge constitute a preliminary given, something like a regulatory source of continuous transformation (the chemical structure of the first assemblages of sensible matter), just as they would a chaotic source of gradual dissolution (the physical structure of an irreversible movement of expenditure). This source of energy, of which the world is full from the smallest elementary particle to the outermost sphere of the fixed stars, would not be inexhaustible. (11)

Before focusing on the idea of a depletion of kinetic energy, note that Plato's text does not unproblematically warrant Margel's use of the concept of "δυνάμεις ἰσχυρᾶς", as if Timaeus' account openly referred to what Margel calls energetic powers. Indeed, in the passage which grounds Margel's use of the expression (33a), one finds Timaeus explaining how the demiurge made the world whole by using the totality of the four elements: "For he perceived that, if a body be composite, when hot things and cold and all things that have strong powers beset that body and attack it from without, they bring it to untimely dissolution." Timaeus' account here does not refer to primary elements as energetic powers. Rather, it simply expresses an analogy according to which certain things externally attacking a composite body are said to possess "strong powers".

But let's admit the demiurge uses elements full of radiating energetic powers. Isn't the universe he creates autarkès, self-sufficient, since it nourishes itself from its own 'waste' as Timaeus emphasizes? Isn't it the case that the universe created by the demiurge has no exterior and thus cannot suffer any loss of 'energy', let alone an "irreversible loss"? What justifies Margel's belief that an "irreducible expenditure of energy from which the world in its totality would silently suffer" occurs? (5, 24-28). Margel writes:

In order to produce the world, the demiurge had to make use of a still amorphous mass of finite energies. The world indeed draws its potential source from a kinetic force, a sort of simultaneous motion between a centripetal and a centrifugal tendency, a whirling force that cannot indefinitely or generally restore more energy than it possesses. In an indefinite time, with respect to the energetic quantum it restitutes, this source is not in a position to add to or compensate for the equivalent sum of the expenditures that the simultaneous operations of its (force of) restitution requires of it. Something fallen and irremediably lost will always result from this world. (28)

Simply put, fire radiates from the stars. This motion of a lighter element leaving its natural site towards the center of the universe, the Earth, causes motions and transformations in the elements it encounters. But this centrifugal force is met with the opposing centripetal tendency that leads each element to its natural site. Now, Margel explains, this "double movement of decomposition by continuous division and recomposition by immediate movement will constitute what we will provisionally call the 'primary time' of the cosmic restitution of the energies and of the irreversible becoming of the world." (28). But again, why does he believe that 'energy' is lost in this double process? How does this loss occur?

The absence of void in Timaeus's physics seems to be the key point. Margel explains,

A certain gap will come about between the proportional, geometrically determinate structure of the elementary bodies of the world and the fundamental equation of the cosmic energies on the basis of which the sensible body of these elements mathematically (or schematically) develops. As small as it may be, this gap will remain an infinite and thus irreducible gap. It will represent -- in the physical and sensible stability of the world -- the irreversible movement of its genesis, its becoming, and its death. (21)

Because void does not exist in Timaeus' account of the world, interstices will "have to be immediately compensated for, and from this movement or this force of continuous replenishment will emerge an irremediable expenditure of energy." (23)

This assumption concerning a loss of kinetic energy at the level of primary elements seems to be the keystone of Margel's whole interpretation. In his view, the intervention of the demiurge does not abolish the energetic loss that occurs in this pre-cosmic state of affairs: "as perfect as the world may be, and as pure as its order and harmony may be, the world in its elementary genesis will rest upon a force of consummation that devours it from within and spontaneously leads it toward a slow but certain death." (3)

While abundant explanations are provided, no solid textual evidence is presented to support this assumption regarding an "internal death principle" (3). Given the fact that Margel constantly refers to Ch. Mugler's book La Physique de Platon, it may be that a more substantial justification is offered by Mugler. But Margel himself acknowledges the lack of evidence when he describes this death drive as "a phenomenon of arche-originary erosion and dissolution of which Plato says almost nothing." (27)

Be that as it may, Margel sees the world as irrevocably 'dying' through this loss of kinetic energy that occurs at the level of the elements. Hence his suggestion to perceive the slowly decaying world as the demiurge's tomb. Combined with his portrait of the demiurge as a "dying god", this description suggests that the demiurge himself is caught in the slow process of decay. Doesn't this suppose that the demiurge is a sensible being? Or does Margel simply mean that the demiurge is figuratively 'dying' qua demiurge? This is not clearly explained, but the repeated allusion to the "demiurge's symbolic death" and "the possibility that the demiurge would no longer be the demiurge" (5) seems to call for a non-literal approach.

Another relatively uncontroversial point Margel uses to support his thesis about the demiurge's powerlessness is that the demiurge delegates part of the production of the world to subordinate gods (7). It is true the demiurge isn't involved in the production of the sublunar world in which humans live. But again, one wonders how delegating part of one's work is equivalent with being inactive or idle, 'désoeuvré'.[6] Saying that the demiurge is désoeuvré seems excessive. It suggests that he does nothing, which is not the case by Margel's own admission.

Indeed, the second most important aspect of the demiurge's finitude that Margel highlights concerns the constant activity of representation involved in his cosmological intervention. The persistence of the sensible world as a well-ordered whole depends on the demiurge's ability to engage in an uninterrupted activity of representation of intelligible forms (52). As already mentioned, Margel believes that the demiurge does not eliminate the death principle: "his cosmic representation (μίμησις) would consist in idealizing this gradual movement of consummation". What "idealizing" a movement of consummation means remains obscure, but Margel explains that the demiurge "maintains this movement for a still indefinite but nonetheless already limited time, in an actual state of equilibrium and conservation" (3). He asks how long the demiurge will maintain this activity on which the world's rational order depends. Here, the notion of promise enters the scene: the demiurge guarantees his continuous involvement through a promise. Margel's introduction of the notion of promise is an obvious extrapolation. True, at 41b, the demiurge explains to the created gods that the persistence of his creation is tied to his benevolent will, but this guarantee is presented more as a state of affairs than a commitment.

If we accept the suggestion and try to relate it to Margel's main thesis, in what way is this 'promise' a sign of weakness on the demiurge's part? The answer seems to be that the need for a promise results from the god's incapacity to provide the world with its own self-sufficient source of order to begin with:

The demiurge's powerlessness would consist precisely in not being able to definitively inscribe the ideal principle of the world's conservation within its elementary genesis. The world's autarky would be purely mimetic, thus irreducibly dependent upon the demiurge's productive or poietic powerlessness. (4)

Once created, isn't the world's soul such an internal, independent, and self-sufficient principle (34b), however?[7]

The image of a god who fails to provide the world with means to sustain itself durably, and periodically withdraws from direct involvement, finds a solid textual basis in Plato's myth of the Politicus (especially 272e-274e). Surprisingly, Margel does not utilize this source to support his thesis. Besides making his 'vision' look more credible, it could have invited comparison between the Timaeus's demiurge and the figure of the legislator which so occupied the late Plato. One could even draw a parallel between the figure of the demiurge and Plato himself, as a political philosopher struggling to find a way to generate a political cosmos able to sustain itself durably without further intervention from its original nomothete.

Of all the aspects included in Margel's account of the demiurge and his creation, the 'sacrifice' part of the story is probably the oddest (see 103-104). If I understand Margel's idea (explanations are increasingly elusive towards the book's end), to compensate for his limitations, the demiurge attempts to save the world by sacrificing part of it. What 'sacrifice' means here remains obscure, but the object of this sacrifice is the sublunar realm where mortal beings live, "a world abandoned to the linear becoming of consummation" (7). Interestingly, Margel draws a parallel between the circuit of metempsychosis in which the souls are caught and the centrifugal/centripetal trajectory of the primary elements already mentioned. The "economy of the soul and metempsychosis" is correlative to the "economy of energetic restitutions of the sensible world," he writes, and it is "through this economy alone that the world, in its totality, will find a guarantee of the demiurge's promises" (110, 115). But how?

At the top of this metempsychosis cycle, humans (males), more precisely philosophers, would be the agents of the world's salvation through the melete thanatou mentioned in the Phaedo. Through this exercise, Margel presents philosophers as replacing the demiurge by taking on his cosmic responsibilities of "preserving the world." (142) Philosophers "must momentarily in the time of his dying, take the demiurge's place and replace it with the thematic order of the concept." (7) The picture becomes weirder and weirder. Through this conceptual activity, philosophers' souls, once detached from the body, become a sort of food for the cosmos ("soul-nourishment" âme-aliment, 137-38). In what way can the thinking activity of philosophers 'save' the world by 'feeding' it? Does Margel really think that the universe is feeding off souls according to Plato? The belief that philosophers are saving the world by reflecting on cosmic order will appear embarrassingly delusional even to the most pretentious. Surely this is a metaphor -- or is it?[8]

A sober way to make sense of this grandiose claim would be to acknowledge that the representation of the "world" as a well-ordered whole finds its source and so depends on philosophers' teleological reflections on the universe. Thus, philosophers would 'save' the 'world' (i.e., they would make it intelligible) by offering the type of rational account of the universe presented in the Timaeus. Isn't such a reassuring cosmic tale a mere "μῦθος" (3), though, another iteration of Plato's noble lie providing 'nourishment' to humans craving intelligibility?[9] Margel does allude to the demiurgic representation of the world as, possibly, a mere "transcendental illusion" (116) and this theme becomes central at the book's end. If this kind of teleological fiction is the type of 'salvation' Margel has in mind, though, we are faced with what French literary critics like to call a mise en abyme, and the question becomes: is it plausible that Plato intended his text to be so understood?

Be that as it may, one benefit of this line of interpretation is to enable the reader to make sense of an intriguing omission. In Zarathustra, Nietzsche alludes to the tomb of a world-producing god.[10] The similarity between Margel's image of a dying demiurge and Nietzsche's text seems too striking to be a pure coincidence. Did Margel expect his readers to connect the dots? One thing is certain, in relation to Nietzsche's text: the idea of Margel's book as a Tombeau in the artistic sense evoked earlier contains rich interpretive possibilities. Indeed, seen as a philosophical Tombeau, Margel's book, with its emphasis on the demiurge's finitude, would constitute a last homage, an 'adieu' to the figure of the demiurge as an all-powerful god, creator of the world, initiated by the Timaeus in Western culture.[11] It would show demiurgic narratives -- even sophisticated philosophical ones -- for what they are: fictions that have reached the end of their cultural life. The twist is that if we believe Margel, the germ of this final dissolution was already present at the very beginning of the tradition, in the Timaeus itself.

[1] Le Tombeau du dieu Artisan précédé de Avances par Jacques Derrida, Paris, Editions de Minuit, 1995.

[2] Margel ascribes the views expressed by Timaeus to Plato without justifying this confusion between author and narrator. This is uncharacteristic in the field of (contemporary) Platonic studies. The lack of explicit critical distance between himself, as author, and what he takes as being Plato's views is also unusual.

[3] A reader not very familiar with the Timaeus could be under the impression that Margel is simply paraphrasing Plato's text since he does not indicate where his descriptions fill in the gaps left by Plato.

[4] Derrida speculates abundantly on the latter in Avances.

[5] This is how Margel, following R. Brague, chooses to translate αἰών.

[6] Lynes' choice of "inoperative" to translate désoeuvré doesn't seem fully adequate. Désoeuvré is psychologically richer. It refers to a state of idleness, often a state of bored idleness, that follows a period of activity.

[7] Margel explains his disagreement: "Of course, the soul of the world, in harmoniously regulating the economic equilibrium of its losses, will have ensured the world's perfect autonomy and an internal form of conservation; however, the principle of this animation would hinge on the demiurge's goodwill." (98)

[8] Derrida, for one, interprets this responsibility to "save the world" quite literally. See Avances, 27, 39.

[9] Derrida, instead of presenting it as a noble lie, speaks of a "promesse intenable." Avances, 30.

[10] See Part 1, 3, "Backworldsmen". I thank Joey Baker for pointing out this parallel to me. My gratitude also goes to Johanna Chalupiak for help in editing this review.

[11] Derrida does not mention Nietzsche, but he does suggest that the "hidden title"of Margel's book could be "tombeau pour un dieu artisan." Avances, 15.