The Tools of Metaphysics and the Metaphysics of Science

Tools Of Metaphysics And The Metaphysics Of Science

Theodore Sider, The Tools of Metaphysics and the Metaphysics of Science, Oxford University Press, 2020, 233pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198811565.

Reviewed by Scott Dixon, Ashoka University


Theodore Sider's book is an important contribution to discussions of cutting edge topics lying at the intersection of metaphysics and the philosophies of mathematics and science. Early on in the book, Sider describes his thesis as the claim that 'the choice of metaphysical tools matters to first-order metaphysics, especially when it comes to "structuralist" positions in the metaphysics of science and mathematics' (3). Structuralist views are those which, in some sense, ontologically "downgrade" certain entities (e.g., numbers, individuals, or posits of scientific theories) relative to the relational framework (the structure) in which they are embedded. Sider is out to explore the prospects for clarifying certain of these structuralist theses by attempting to formulate them with various concepts from postmodal hyperintensional metaphysics, such as essence, grounding, and fundamentality, including Sider's own take on fundamentality, developed in Sider 2011.

In some cases, Sider finds success in these attempts. In those cases, he argues that his own view about fundamentality is best poised to provide adequate formulations of the relevant theses in postmodal terms. Sider believes the real structure of the world is reflected by a certain set of concepts, the fundamental concepts, which include concepts associated with a variety of syntactic categories, including terms, predicates, and quantifiers. Sider's view contrasts with the typical view that the structure of reality consists of a hierarchy of facts or other entities related by dependence relations like grounding. In other cases, however, Sider admits that even his view of fundamentality might not solve every problem, leaving unanswered the question of how the theory at issue can be formulated in postmodal terms.

The first view Sider discusses, in chapter 2, is nomic essentialism. A modal characterization of the view is straightforward: you can't have the same properties in a world in which they play different roles in the laws of nature at that world. But, Sider argues, it is inadequate, at least in the eyes of the postmodal metaphysician, since it fails to provide an explanation of why this modal claim holds. Sider's thesis in this chapter is that, despite this need, nomic essentialism cannot easily be characterized in postmodal terms, even when one avails herself of Sider's preferred account of fundamentality. The most straightforward essence-based formulation of nomic essentialism has that, for certain properties related to one another by a law of nature, they are so related because they are essentially so related. Sider notes that this does not yield a "laws-to-properties direction of influence", instead resting everything on the natures of the properties.

Nor can one do much better of a job with grounding or even Siderian fundamentality. Sider thinks that the nomic essentialist must say either that the properties (or concepts, if you're Sider) which figure into (the fundamental descriptions of) the laws of nature at a world are not fundamental, or that singular facts involving the instantiation of these properties are not fundamental. But endorsing the first claim wouldn't amount to an account of the connection between the properties (or concepts) and the laws, which is one of the primary things the postmodal metaphysician is after. And the most straightforward ways of filling out the second claim in postmodal terms aren't fruitful either. The nomic essentialist could replace, or ground, the singular instantiation facts involving scientific properties of the form 'is F' with fundamental existential facts of the form

(1) for some property p, plays nomic role and has p,

where ais some individual that has the scientific property in question. But, Sider notes, this conflicts with the well-entrenched principle that existential generalizations are grounded in their instances, a Siderian analog of which is the principle that "if an existentially quantified statement expresses a fundamental fact, then so do all of its true instances" (36). After all, these principles would push one toward the view that the instantiation facts themselves are fundamental, which is contrary to the spirit of nomic essentialism.

In chapter 3, Sider shifts his focus from structuralist views that downgrade properties to ones that downgrade individuals. One way such views are often put is as the claim that the relevant individuals are just positions in structures. But this characterization, Sider notes, is confusing, since individuals are apparently countenanced; they are identified with positions, and positions are apparently countenanced. Sider proceeds by looking at a number of different ways of formulating this thesis more clearly in postmodal terms, and showing that none is wholly adequate.

Sider considers four views: the bundle theory, bare particulars, priority monism, and generalism. He expertly steers us between metaphysics and metametaphysics through his criticisms of these views. In some cases, as with bare particulars, the view fails to secure for the structuralist everything she wants. In particular, it fails to ensure that "there are no fundamental scenarios differing solely by a permutation of individuals over qualitative roles" (96). According to the bare particulars view, particulars still exist; they just don't have any (fundamental) properties. In other cases, as with a universals-based bundle theory (according to which particulars are just bundles of universals), the view secures this (particulars are "reduced away" as bundles of properties), but is objectionable for first-order reasons. Such a bundle theory, for example, does not allow for the existence of distinct duplicates. And, Sider adds, bundle theorists are typically silent about the nature of relations. Moreover, he believes, they are not likely to provide an account of relations soon, since relations, being inter-particular sorts of entities, don't seem amenable to "fitting within" a single bundle. Sider dutifully mentions relational properties at this point, and considers the possibility that the bundle theorist can replace relations with relational properties. He is not, however, optimistic about the prospect. But there may be reason for more optimism. Maureen Donnelly (2016, 2021) develops a compelling account of relational application in terms of the instantiation of relational properties that can be modified to eliminate relations altogether (2016: 99), potentially providing an alternative to relations that would be acceptable to the bundle theorist.

Sider thinks generalism is the most promising approach to formulating a structuralist account of individuals. Roughly, generalism is the idea that the fundamental facts are general in that they do not involve reference to individuals. Sider focuses on Shamik Dasgupta's (2009, 2016) version of generalism in his criticism. But he also discusses and criticizes a closely related version: quantifier generalism. For the sake of brevity, I'll frame my summary in terms of the latter. According to quantifier generalism, the fundamental facts are all quantificational facts, of the form ∃x𝜑(x) or ∀x𝜑(x). Sider's complaint about generalism is novel and interesting. First, he notes that, to provide an adequate fundamental description of the world, the generalist is committed to a form of holism in her fundamental facts. Suppose the world is how an individualist would describe as such that both Rab and Sab, where Rand are relations and and are individuals. The generalist can't posit two general fundamental facts [∃xyRxy] and [∃xySxy], since these facts fail to indicate that the individuals involved in the first fact are the same ones that are involved in the second. Instead, the generalist must posit a single fundamental fact [∃xy(Rxy & Sxy)].

Of course, in the actual world, many more than two individuals would exist on the individualist's account. And they would stand in many more than two relations to one another. So the fundamental facts posited by the generalist need to be logically much more complex than the one I just mentioned. Indeed, the world might be such that an individualist would describe it as having an infinite number of individuals and an infinite number of instantiations of relations by them. To accommodate this, the generalist needs an infinite fact involving an infinite number of quantifiers and an infinite number of conjuncts. The reason this poses a problem for the generalist, Sider thinks, is because the infinitary quantification and conjunction that the generalist is committed to in her fundamental facts must be primitive. Since these logical operations appear in the generalist's fundamental facts, they cannot be reduced to their finitary counterparts. Sider admits that generalism might have virtues numerous enough to outweigh this disadvantage. But it is nonetheless an interesting observation about generalism, and ought to be considered in a comprehensive evaluation of the view.

In chapter 4, Sider turns his attention to quantitative properties. He does not argue that the structuralist view at issue, comparativism, can't be formulated in postmodal terms in a way that satisfies the structuralist. He thinks it is a straightforward matter to accomplish this. Comparativism can be formulated in terms of Siderian fundamentality as the view that "fundamental quantitative concepts ascribe quantities to concrete objects comparatively" (122). So, for example, while we say that this laptop is 1 kg in mass and this dictionary is 2 kg in mass, what is going on fundamentally, according to the comparativist, is that this laptop and dictionary stand in a certain relation to one another; the dictionary is twice as massive as the laptop. The absolutist denies this, saying that what's going on at the fundamental level is that the laptop is 1 kg in mass and the dictionary is 2 kg in mass (or, to avoid reference to kilograms in their fundamental description of the world, that the laptop is this mass and the dictionary is that mass).

Instead, Sider argues that comparativism and absolutism face other problems. Both the absolutist and the comparatist, he argues, are forced to choose between, on the one hand, introducing arbitrariness into the fundamental laws (relating to the units those laws are expressed with) and allowing for determinism to be true, and, on the other, avoiding such arbitrariness but being unable to allow for determinism. (Sider draws here on David Baker's (2020) argument that comparativism conflicts with determinism.) This chapter functions as a sincere discussion of a serious challenge to Sider's 2011 view about fundamentality. He is honest about the prospect that this might spell doom for that project, at least for anyone who is unwilling to adopt either of those two choices. But, having rejected grounding and essence as inappropriate for framing absolutism and compartivism, it is not clear how the postmodalist can accommodate these views.

In chapter 5, Sider turns his attention to theoretical equivalence, of both scientific and metaphysical theories. We might think a theory of the world might be framed with universal quantification and negation or with existential quantification and negation. Presumably, the two theories are equivalent. Sider's central focus in this chapter is the question of what it is for two theories like these to be equivalent. After considering and rejecting traditional accounts, involving relations of translation, synonymy, and truth in the same possible worlds, as being either too coarse- or fine-grained, Sider develops a view of theoretical equivalence in terms of his account of fundamentality; "equivalent theories are those that say the same thing about the world at the fundamental level, those that give the same description of the world in terms of fundamental concepts" (185).

Sider ends the discussion of theoretical equivalence by considering a very different approach: quotienting. When someone quotients, she takes the position that two theories are equivalent without explaining why. On the fundamentality-based account of equivalence just described, the equivalence of the theory framed with ∀ and ~, and that framed with ∃ and ~, can be explained by asserting that there is a language -- that is more fundamental than both the one that results from taking ∀ and ~ as primitive, and the one that takes ∃ and ~ as primitive -- that can be used to correctly represent the basic structure of the world. The quotienter, on the other hand, gives no explanation for why the two theories are equivalent, assuming she takes these two theories to be equivalent, which she will typically do on the basis of a rather coarse-grained notion, such as whether they are true in the same possible worlds. Sider thinks that quotienting is an accurate representation of the attitudes that some less metaphysically inclined individuals take toward equivalence. Quotienters are those, Sider thinks, who say things like "what is real is that which is common to all the members of the equivalence class" of some equivalent theories (195). He notes that this statement is obscure until it is understood in terms of quotienting, as an assertion of the equivalence of the theories about the world in question without an explanation of why they are equivalent, i.e., without an account of what it is about the nature of the world that makes them equivalent.

Sider is ultimately concerned about the viability of quotienting, at least for a postmodal metaphysician who desires explanations in contexts like these. But he draws a larger lesson from this discussion of equivalence, together with his discussions of the topics in the previous chapters. It concerns the connection between the acceptability of metaphysical theories and how far one is inclined to keep pushing for explanations. The quotienter, for example, is happy to stop at the claim that two theories about the world are equivalent. This gives her all she wants in terms of insight into the nature of the world. But the proponent of fundamentality disagrees; there is more to the world that explains why these theories about it are equivalent. Sider thus concludes that the tools we choose to work with influence the sorts of theories we take to be adequate. Fine-grained hyperintensional tools like fundamentality will, to put it metaphorically, create more openings into which explanations can be fit, thereby placing burdens on the theorist to supply such explanations. By working with less fine-grained tools, no such openings arise, so fewer explanations are needed on the whole, and one can get by, in developing their theory, with less.

A striking aspect of this book is the relatively dismal picture Sider paints of the prospect of formulating structuralist theses in postmodal terms. A straightforward way to resist the picture is to develop alternative postmodal formulations of the structuralist theses Sider discusses. That might involve making use of postmodal tools we already have in ways that Sider and others have not yet considered. Or it might involve developing new postmodal tools whose usefulness outstrips that of essence, grounding, and fundamentality. Sider considers a number of views, so the task is not an easy one even on the much less ambitious former approach. Additionally, Sider rejects some of the views for first-order reasons, and these arguments will have to be dealt with as well. I've merely hinted at the possibility in just one case -- that of the bundle theory -- that it might be better off than Sider thinks. But this is at best only a first step toward redeeming our postmodal tools in the context of structuralist metaphysics. It may be that the postmodal metaphysician is better off pursuing non-structuralist alternatives in many of the cases in which Sider finds structuralist positions problematic.


Baker, D. J. 2020. "Some consequences of physics for the comparative metaphysics of quantity." In Bennett, K. and D. W. Zimmerman (eds.), Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, Vol. 12. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Dasgupta, S. 2009. "Individuals: An essay in revisionary metaphysics." Philosophical Studies, 145, 35-67.

Dasgupta, S. 2016. "Can we do without fundamental individuals? Yes." In Barnes, E. (ed.) Current Controversies in Metaphysics. London: Routledge, pp. 7-23.

Donnelly, M. 2016. "Positionalism revisited." In Marmodoro, A. and D. Yates (eds.), The Metaphysics of Relations, 80-99. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Donnelly, M. 2021. "Explaining the differential application of non-symmetric relations." Synthese, 1-24.

Sider, T. 2011. Writing the Book of the World. Oxford: Oxford University Press.