The Transcendental Turn

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Sebastian Gardner and Matthew Grist (eds.), The Transcendental Turn, Oxford University Press, 2015, 380pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198724872.

Reviewed by Robert Howell, University at Albany, SUNY, and Moscow State University


The idea of a special "transcendental knowledge," an autonomous philosophical cognition that marks out necessary structures in our knowledge and its objects, goes back to Kant. The idea continues in the nineteenth century and is stressed anew by Husserl (who introduces the talk of a transcendental turn) and his successors. The present volume is part of a revived interest in such philosophy among Anglophone thinkers in the past fifty or so years. It derives from a research project organized by the late Mark Sacks.

The volume collects important studies on the relations of key European thinkers to the transcendental tradition: Kant (essays by Henry E. Allison, Karl Ameriks, Paul Abela); Fichte (Daniel Breazeale, Rolf-Peter Horstmann, Paul Guyer); Hegel (Robert Pippin, Stephen Houlgate); Nietzsche (Béatrice Han-Pile); Husserl, phenomenology, and Heidegger (Dan Zahavi, Steven Crowell, Taylor Carman, Cristina Lafont); Merleau-Ponty (Sebastian Gardner); Wittgenstein (Stephen Mulhall); and (as a pre-Kantian predecessor) the Stoics (Wayne M. Martin). Gardner contributes an introduction. The essays are intended to elucidate the thought of these thinkers and the extent to which they belong to a transcendental tradition incorporating metaphilosophical views deriving from Kant. It is impossible to do full justice here to any of the discussions, but I will note main points and various questions that arise.

In the first Critique, Kant describes transcendental cognition as an (i) a priori, (ii) second-order investigation into the nature of our a priori knowledge. (iii) This investigation examines the cognitive faculties of the knowing subjects. (iv) Its characteristic mode of argument is "transcendental proof," which establishes conditions necessary for the possibility of knowledge. (v) The Copernican Revolution -- objects conform to our a priori knowledge, rather than conversely -- encapsulates Kant's strategy; and (vi) this conformity is understood according to Kant's transcendental idealism. The authors in this volume tend to stress various features descending from this cluster, although they do not agree on all the details. Kant's understanding of (v) and (vi) also has been disputed recently, and aspects of that dispute appear in the opening contributions by Allison and Ameriks.

Allison develops a new approach to his earlier nonmetaphysical interpretation of transcendental idealism. This approach is independent of his original interpretation but, for him, helps to explain the attractions of such interpretations. Allison argues that besides using "transcendental" in the Critical way indicated above, Kant also uses it in a traditional ontological fashion to refer to features predicated of all objects in general, of objects "as such." The traditional ontological framework assumes that space and time apply to objects in general and so with strict universality (28). One might now take Kant's transcendental turn simply as a move within this framework -- a move denying spatiotemporality to any objects in general (regarded as existing in cognition-independent forms) and restricting it to objects as they appear. However, it is preferable to read this turn as a deflationary move rejecting the traditional framework altogether and adopting a new, nonmetaphysical view. That view takes spatiotemporal predicates simply to apply to all objects of our possible experience without introducing any ontologically separate realm of objects in themselves.

Like his original interpretation, Allison's new approach raises important questions. I believe, however, that this approach is historically mistaken. It appears that space and time are not considered, in the traditional ontology, transcendental predicates that belong universally to objects as such. Thus Baumgarten takes space and time to belong only to composite beings, not to simples (Metaphysica, §§230 ff., §§239-42); and he takes space and time not to belong to God (§§840-42, 849-50).[1] As far as I can tell, there never was an ontological view, utilized by Kant, that attributes space and time flatly to all beings as such, a view that Kant then replaces with Allison's deflationary treatment. Moreover, Kant's "concept of an object in general" -- a concept which, as far as I know, does not feature in the traditional ontologies -- can be used to judge that (as Descartes holds) some entities as such are spatial, but others are not. Kant's mere use of this concept thus doesn't support Allison. I also don't see the philosophical attractions of Allison's approach, unless it abandons Kant's idealism altogether and reads him as a realist.

Ameriks wants to distance Kant from extreme forms of a metaphysics of things in themselves while defending the legitimacy of metaphysics within Kant's position. For Ameriks, the Transcendental Turn claims, nonmetaphysically, that "there are immanently determinable necessary structures of our experience and its objects," structures discovered by investigating "what is immanently demanded by our own epistemic practices" (36, 35). Kant's appeal to idealism to explain the existence of these structures is a separate claim that does, however, make metaphysical commitments.

Ameriks proposes a three-level Kantian account. In Hegelian metaphysics, the Concept is the fundamental, unconditioned thing. In Ameriks' Kantian account, the third, fundamental level consists of things in themselves. On these things depend the second-level things, the spatiotemporal objects that we know. The first level is the private mental items (sensations, thoughts, etc.), through which we know those objects. The second-level things are empirically real but still count as appearances -- not because they depend subjectivistically on individual minds, but because (analogously to Hegel's view) they are conditioned by and so depend on the fundamental level, things in themselves. (Compare the idea that colors, although phenomenally real features of objects, depend on the physical microstructure that determines how objects visually appear.)

Ameriks' interpretation has many attractions and deserves extended development. Two concerns: first, if Kant's proofs of idealism fail, we lack good reasons to accept the three-level view as true, although some naturalized version might still be defensible, à la Sellars' picture of the manifest and scientific images of the world. Second, Ameriks' interpretation looks like reconstruction, not simple Kant interpretation. There are, for instance, strongly subjectivist elements in Kant that Ameriks' reading plays down. (Thus, for Kant, I -- the I to which objects appear -- appear to myself in inner sense as an individual, finite mind; and so on.)

Breazeale and Horstmann describe Fichte's responses to Kant. Breazeale notes that Fichte's method of a priori genetic description is meant to fill gaps in Kant's account of how transcendental philosophy proceeds. By "thinking the I" in self-positing acts, observing what further acts that thinking requires, then observing the requirements of those further acts, and so on, one determines the a priori structure of the world. Breazeale gives a very useful, even-handed account of Fichte's views and the difficulties that arise.

Horstmann argues that Fichte's focus on first-person consciousness is part of the German idealists' attempts to escape skepticism about Kant's theory. In something of an expositional tour de force, he surveys major Fichtean arguments in the Wissenschaftslehre from 1794 to after 1800 and provides critical evaluations. Up to around 1800 Fichte tries to ground knowledge in a fact (say, the "A = A" truth) or in an act (of self-positing). After that, he focuses on "absolute knowing." His thought then becomes extraordinarily obscure. But Horstmann gives comprehensible sketches of main ideas even here. Like Breazeale's, his essay does an excellent job of explaining Fichte and will help anyone struggling with the texts.

Abela and Guyer focus on ethics. Abela defends the anti-naturalistic force of Kant's account of moral obligation. However, meeting our moral obligations is, for Kant, framed by the task of realizing the highest good (of making oneself worthy of happiness). Achieving happiness is in fact central to the successful employment of practical reason. Kant's characterization of that task converges in rewarding ways with current empirical research on happiness.

Guyer examines Fichte's discussion, in the 1798 System of Ethics, of Kant's theory of practical reason. Fichte takes transcendental philosophy to discover the structures in experience that are necessary for the possibility of experience. He identifies these structures by appeal to the self's self-positing actions. Fichte tries, by appeal to those actions, to solve three problems for Kant: (a) demonstrating the holding of the categorical imperative; (b) showing that the moral law manifests itself through a special feeling of respect; (c) making Kant's proof of freedom compatible with the fact that people sometimes act immorally. Guyer brings out the intrinsic interest of Fichte's attempts to resolve these problems. The attempts may not fully succeed. But anyone concerned with these issues can benefit from Guyer's discussion.

With Fichte, we are still close to Kant's own understanding of transcendental philosophy. The work of Hegel and the later thinkers treated in this volume begins to diverge more sharply from Kant, although crucial aspects of their ideas still derive from his approach.

Pippin updates his influential, nonmetaphysical reading of Hegel. What one might call Hegel's metaphysics is a "logic" that yields the categories via which we experience the world. Unlike Kant, Hegel doesn't restrict these categories to human experience or transcendentally deduce them. But he is still a transcendental philosopher. He holds, for example, that "objective purport" (the possibility of reference to objects) requires a categorial structuring of experience.

Pippin argues from this perspective that, without appealing to non-conceptual content, Hegel can account for empirical constraints on knowledge. The self-negation performed by the subject of thought involves the idea that that subject regards its judgments as defeasible. Hegel's "self-determination of the Concept" allows for individual conceptual views (and the normative authority of conditions of objective purport) to be corrected from the inside, not through nonconceptual experience but through our experience of the partiality of our own conceptions. Pippin covers many related topics in a dense, allusive discussion. He touches elliptically on other significant recent interpretations -- for example, accounts of Hegel's relations to skepticism; and the metaphysical reading mentioned above, which yields a conceptual monism in which the Concept dialectically differentiates into the natural world and our own reasoning and then, in our reasoning, obtains absolute knowledge of itself. Pippin may defend his interpretation as one that makes philosophical sense of central Hegelian points, but the recent interpretations are historically compelling. Readers of Pippin's essay will learn valuable new things about his ideas. His opponents will hold, however, that he does not make clear how far Hegel's actual views count as transcendental.

Houlgate argues against treating the Phenomenology of Spirit as Kantian transcendental philosophy. Kant's transcendental approach identifies, through transcendental arguments, conditions of ordinary consciousness; these arguments depend on premises that Kant simply assumes. But, for Hegel, this appeal to assumptions begs the question against other positions. It also runs contrary to Hegel's idea that it is through a purely phenomenological, presuppositionless study of the commitments made by ordinary consciousness that we ultimately reach -- not Kantian conditions for the possibility of our finite attempts to know individual objects -- but the standpoint of absolute knowledge.

Houlgate makes a convincing case. But the discussion is hampered by the differing accounts of "transcendental" that are available. Read liberally, Ameriks' above characterization can be applied to the Phenomenology, after all. That book shows the rational, necessary structure that is disclosed in our experience. It does so by studying natural consciousness's increasingly accurate understanding of the epistemic practices that ultimately yield "actual knowledge of what truly is." So in this sense it counts as transcendental philosophy.

Han-Pile's essay brings us to a further philosopher whose transcendental bonds have been controverted. Maudemarie Clark and Brian Leiter both argue that Nietzsche begins as a transcendental idealist but eventually adopts naturalism. Han-Pile replies that the texts show that he struggles between such positions throughout his career; he is best read as trying to overcome the transcendental-naturalistic divide. While later rejecting things in themselves, he continues to accept a priori forms that structure objects. But these forms do so not in a traditional, unconditionally necessary way but only relative to our differing perspectives on the world. The forms evolve along with the perspectives; they persist when they preserve and enhance the way of life that embodies them. Han-Pile compares this naturalized a priori to Michel Foucault's idea of a "historical a priori."

The interesting idea of a relativized a priori recurs in later essays, and Han-Pile's discussion throws important light on Nietzsche. However, I suspect that Clark and Leiter will simply respond that Nietzsche sketches a high-level, naturalistic theory of how epistemic perspectives, with their a priori forms, arise for evolutionary reasons and persist to the extent that, pragmatically evaluated, they further our interests. Han-Pile's apparent rejection of such a reading seems to depend on a narrow view of what counts as naturalistic explanation (see 212, 213).

The phenomenologists' treatments of the transcendental now come into focus. Zahavi gives a lucid overview of Husserl's transformations of that notion. For Husserl, phenomenology is transcendental insofar as it explores the essential conditions, within our experience, of objects' being given to us. Husserl generalizes experience to include all modes of experiencing entities. He criticizes Kant's approach as metaphysically contaminated and rejects Kant's transcendental argumentation.

Zahavi also stresses the fundamental importance to Husserl of intersubjectivity. Unlike Kant, Husserl argues that my constitutive acts of positing entities depend on my experience of other subjects. The subject must be socialized and embodied in the world it constitutes. There is no fixed world, only worlds relative to the structures taken as normal within a social tradition. In the end (and consonant with Foucault's view of phenomenology), Husserl undermines any strict transcendental-empirical distinction. Transcendental and empirical perspectives become complementary, not incompatible.

Crowell describes the development of Heidegger's work from Husserl's. Like Zahavi, Crowell takes Husserl to generalize Kant by investigating conditions on the general possibility of our experiencing objects as such-and-such, as having various sorts of meaning. This investigation proceeds through a second-order study of first-person intentional experiences. It is normative: it determines what grounds our claims -- defeasible, and so norm-governed -- to experience something of a given sort.

Husserl explains such grounds in terms of rule-governed relations among the acts of perception (noeses) that present the object to the subject, anticipate its future appearance, and so on. For Heidegger, such acts are abstractions; they have their identities only as parts of totalities governed by the abilities and skills that the subject exercises on the object. Practical intentionality is thus necessary for act intentionality. But practical intentionality is not sufficient; the object must count as being such-and-such. So I must be able to regard the object as satisfying the norms for being such-and-such. I cannot do that, however, unless I take myself (and my regarding) to be subject to norms, treat myself as able to succeed or fail in my projects. But my so taking myself is not passive; it is a commitment I make. So it is because I can commit myself to norms that things themselves are subjected to norms by me and so are disclosed, in my experience, as being of such-and-such sorts. For Heidegger, phenomenology is thus transcendental insofar as it accounts, in this way, for the possibility of intentionality. Crowell's rich, compact discussion does an excellent job of elucidating this central Heideggerian train of thought.

Carman examines Heidegger's view of truth. Heideggerian truth is correctness, correctness being an "uncovering." Ernst Tugendhat has objected that regarding truth as an unconcealment won't distinguish truth from falsity. But Heidegger is not giving a theory of truth; he simply describes the kind of experience that motivates us to regard a belief as true. Uncovering is itself a kind of commitment -- to regard a belief as true, we must have it. As regards the transcendental, Carman says simply that truth is ontologically fundamental to transcendental philosophy. One wonders about the prospects for a viable Heideggerian account of truth itself. And does regarding a belief as true imply having it? Can't I take your first belief yesterday to be true without having that belief myself?

Lafont confronts a tension in Being and Time that resembles the one that Han-Pile sees in Nietzsche. As Crowell notes elsewhere, that book is supposed to continue the ahistorical investigations of traditional transcendental philosophy into necessary structures of human experience. But the book also stresses the radical historicity of human existence. In response, Lafont develops her own hermeneutic reading: Heidegger is committed to a priori structures in experience, but structures of a relativized sort.

Heidegger investigates the transcendental conditions of understanding anything as meaningful. Lafont agrees that these general conditions will be universal. But our experiences of entities depend, in a transcendental-idealist way, on our underlying projections of those entities' structures. These projections vary with our contexts; each projection assumes a particular structure, a priori relative to that projection, which the entities recognized by that projection must satisfy. The result is an incommensurable, idealistic, conceptual pluralism. Heidegger's relativization of the a priori undermines traditional transcendental readings of his work. But because he still takes our meaning projections to structure our experience of entities, that work remains within the transcendental orbit.

This is an illuminating discussion that raises many questions about Heidegger, questions reinforced by the themes shared with Han-Pile's essay. Given Lafont's incommensurabilist interpretation, the concern about the possibility of a Heideggerian account of truth also returns with a vengeance. In addition, Crowell has recently argued that Heidegger can allow for universal norms independent of particular interpretive frameworks. He also criticizes Lafont's notion of Heidegger's "hermeneutic idealism".[2] One hopes that Lafont will respond. This debate raises fundamental issues of interpretation.

Gardner offers a philosophically fascinating account of Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology. He rejects the "Psychological Interpretation," which takes Merleau-Ponty's work to converge with the naturalistic kinds of philosophy of mind that invoke Merleau-Ponty in their studies. On Gardner's "Transcendental Interpretation," Merleau-Ponty develops an antinaturalistic form of transcendental philosophy that is committed to a transcendental-idealist metaphysics.

Merleau-Ponty wants to understand perception's objectual character, its articulation into objects. That character is inexplicable by objective thought. Rather, it is explained by discovering transcendental -- a priori, necessary -- conditions of experience's objectual character. Such conditions are necessities present within concrete, pre-objective experience, not externally imposed conceptual forms. The presence of the phenomenal body is such a condition, as is pre-objective perception, given through the body. Moreover, our human existence has features (intersubjectivity, temporality, freedom) that themselves cannot be grasped objectively. For this fact to hold, the world itself must have a pre-objective character. (This is the experienced world, treated idealistically as existing only relative to perceiving subjects; it is this world that is grounded in pre-objective being.) The result is a special transcendental idealism. Empirical reality is not, contra Kant, constituted through intuition and objectivity concepts. Instead, it is given through the pre-objective, perceptual world, which itself is shot through with ambiguities in a way that objective thought cannot capture.

This theory is anti-naturalistic. Merleau-Ponty does not synthesize transcendental philosophy and empirical science. He appeals to psychology simply to free transcendental philosophy from objective-thought misconceptions of perception. The parts of psychology worth saving are to be transformed into phenomenology.

This is an enlightening, comprehensive discussion that makes a forceful case for its conclusions. It should be an asset to everyone interested in Merleau-Ponty. To note three points: (a) even given Gardner's interpretation, it doesn't follow -- and Gardner doesn't claim -- that Merleau-Ponty's work shouldn't continue to function as a resource for naturalistic philosophy of mind. (b) We still need to ask whether Merleau-Ponty's idealism, distinctive as Gardner shows it to be, is philosophically viable. (c) Merleau-Ponty's position, as described by Gardner, may be unnaturalizable. Still, naturalistic interpreters will surely propose analogues. Thus Merleau-Ponty's account might be read as a high-level, but empirically-based, theoretical description of basic relations that obtain among our experiences and their phenomenal objects, those relations holding insofar as our experiences and those objects exist inside the manifest image. That image and those relations would then depend on whatever is the underlying physical reality.

The book concludes with Wittgenstein and the Stoics. Mulhall makes a pointed case against Bernard Williams' well-known reading of the later Wittgenstein as a transcendental idealist. He demonstrates that Wittgenstein need not be taken to espouse the "first-person plural" idealism that Williams describes, and he develops an attractive alternative reading of Wittgenstein's grammatical remarks about what "we" say. However, I suspect that much still remains to be determined, beyond this dispute with Williams, about Wittgenstein's overall transcendental affinities.

Martin notes that from premises about the possibility of certain sorts of experience (desires, perceptions), some Stoics infer the existence of a kind of self-consciousness -- namely, the existence of an implicit, nonconceptual understanding of (and concern for) the body and what preserves it. These inferences resemble Kantian arguments from the possibility of experience. So the Stoics develop a proof strategy that leads eventually to Kant's transcendental proofs and beyond.

Martin is right to investigate possible antecedents to Kant. But the Stoic self-consciousness is implicit and nonconceptual, unlike Kant's I think; the Stoic claims apply to all animals, not just to beings with discursive understandings; and, as Martin notes, the Stoic arguments aren't a priori in the Kantian way. Moreover, the abstract argument structure here -- from the possibility of exercising quasi-cognitive capacities to logico-metaphysical conclusions about us or the world -- is found before the Stoics. Note, for example, Phaedo 74a-76a, arguing for (recollection of) the Forms, and various versions of Aristotle's defense of noncontradiction. In appealing to specifically conceptual capacities, these arguments seem closer to Kant's transcendental proofs than does the Stoic reasoning. Yet none of these ancient inferences suggests anything like the Copernican Revolution, and I know no evidence that they influenced Kant. Martin is right in claiming that the Stoics (among other classical thinkers) employ an argument structure that Kant also uses. But in seeing "an ancient precedent for Kant's transcendental approach" in the Stoics' work (342), he goes too far, if he goes beyond that specific structural claim.

Martin's essay leads to a central question for this anthology -- what is transcendental philosophy and the "turn"? Individual authors do a fine job of interpreting their philosophers; some of these essays should become standard references for their topics. The authors and their chosen thinkers focus on one or more of the Kantian points noted above, or on descendants of those points, extending or radically transforming them. But they don't agree on exactly what transcendental philosophy and the turn come to. Is there really a well-defined such philosophy whose delineation will yield historical insights and perhaps new tools for systematic thought?[3]

In the Introduction, and without trying to give an exact definition, Gardner proposes five characteristics of transcendental philosophy. It (a) accepts the need for metaphysics; (b) seeks anti-skeptical foundations; (c) derives such foundations, as conditions of possibility, from the subject's cognitive powers; (d) views those conditions as forming a logic with a normative character; and (e) uses a distinctive mode of transcendental argumentation.

These characteristics, and Gardner's subsequent discussion, are interesting. They overlap the six Kantian features noted above. But they drop Kant's focus on a priori knowledge; they stress metaphysics more than all the transcendental figures in this volume will accept; (b), (c), and (d) don't seem to be accepted (at least in the same sense) by all the philosophers involved; and (e) is abandoned by at least Nietzsche and the phenomenologists. (Hegel also rejects (e), given Houlgate's discussion.) Neither Kant's nor Gardner's set of features in fact provides necessary and sufficient conditions for the current understandings of "transcendental." Given this fact and the divergent past uses of the term, I doubt the assumption (which some of Gardner's later comments seem to suggest) that there is a single definite, theoretically-useful notion of transcendental method that is still awaiting its exact delineation by philosophers.

Perhaps there is such a notion, but the historical development, as evidenced in this volume, suggests a shifting group of features united by their origins in the Kantian cluster noted above and especially in Kant's idea of a priori conditions for the possibility of knowledge and his notion of the Copernican Revolution. Roughly, Kant, Fichte, Hegel, and Nietzsche focus on conditions for the possibility of knowledge of various sorts. The phenomenologists then shift this focus by isolating, within it, the notion of conditions for the possibility of intentionality, of reference to objects. They also generalize by considering such reference wherever it occurs. (Within this shift there then occur further transitions, for example from Kant's I think to Fichte's self-positing I-act; to first-person, phenomenological awareness; and beyond.) In both these approaches, the Copernican notion appears that features of the objects experienced are somehow idealistically constituted or otherwise constrained by the structure of our experience.

If this picture of the development of transcendental thought is right, we need more historical as well as systematic study -- for example, the role of the neo-Kantians in establishing current conceptions of the transcendental appears central but isn't considered in this book.[4] Gardner is well aware of the ongoing character of this research; the volume and his introduction are refreshingly open-minded about these issues. But all this needs further investigation.

Finally, what are the prospects for transcendental philosophy, as its development is laid out in this volume? I've indicated sympathy for naturalized forms of transcendental theories, and this idea has certainly been pursued by many contemporary analytic thinkers. One will have to see where this project goes -- and whether any genuinely autonomous, a priori form of transcendental investigation is still viable. Gardner's introduction contains thoughtful reflections about such issues. The widespread although not universal acceptance of transcendental idealism by major transcendental philosophers also needs further testing. The tests won't come just from analytic philosophers, various of whom have of course criticized idealism at least since G. E. Moore. The European New Realists have now opened new lines of attack, and those sympathetic to transcendental idealism need to answer all these criticisms, not just to rehearse the usual arguments. About such idealism Gardner's introduction also contains stimulating remarks.

Whatever the outcome of these questions, this is a fine anthology of first-rate essays on one of the great sequences of work in modern philosophy. I recommend it wholeheartedly; the fact that it raises such issues is a tribute to its value.


Thanks to Brad Armour-Garb, Ron McClamrock, Nathan Powers, and Vadim Vasilyev for helpful discussions of these topics.

[1] See Kant, Academy edition, 17:78 ff., 163, 165; Courtney Fugate and John Hymers, trans., Alexander Baumgarten, Metaphysics (Bloomsbury, 2013). Scotus recognizes transcendentals that are not common to all beings -- e.g., disjunctive transcendentals such as "finite"-"infinite." See Wouter Goris and Jan Aertsen, "Medieval Theories of Transcendentals" §4.3, Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Summer 2013. Compare Baumgarten, Metaphysica, §6; "Metaphysik Mrongovius," 29:784. Baumgarten's space and time predicates seem to fall here. He defines them in the chapter "Internal disjunctive predicates of a being." Note also Ameriks, 46-47.

[2] Steven Crowell, Normativity and Phenomenology in Husserl and Heidegger (Cambridge University Press, 2013).

[3] Lafont notes Sami Pihlström's contention that nothing actually distinguishes transcendental from other kinds of philosophy ("Recent Reinterpretations of the Transcendental," Inquiry, 2004, 47, 289-314).

[4] See Frederick Beiser on Hermann Cohen's "discovery of the transcendental" in The Genesis of Neo-Kantianism, 1796-1880 (Oxford University Press, 2014).