The Transhistorical Image: Philosophizing Art and its History

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Crowther, Paul, The Transhistorical Image: Philosophizing Art and its History, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 218pp, $55.00 (hbk). ISBN 0521811147.

Reviewed by Daniel Herwitz , University of Michigan


This book attempts an analytic reconstruction of how picturing takes place in painting. Ranging from mediaeval figuration to contemporary abstraction, the book argues that the two-dimensional surface of the picture plane can be understood to provide something like the basis for a set of distinctive logical spaces through which picturing can happen. These logical spaces are what allow the varieties of picturing which the history of art has exhibited. They are the condition of the possibility of such styles of picturing. Terms like ‘logical space’, ‘pictorial syntax’ and ‘pictorial content’ or ‘semantics’ are liberally applied throughout this book, with comparatively little (if any) discussion of what would be at stake in thinking of painting as a kind of visual language. Indeed, these terms tend to run together without notice, leading the reader to wonder whether what is at stake is pictorial syntax, a theory of meaning for pictorial content, or just plain discussions of the grounds of style, and to question the entire force of the analogy between style and language.

It is best to get at Crowther’s view by considering the starting point of the book, namely Panofsky’s theory of perspective. Panofsky attempts to understand how certain styles are undergirded by specific categories of form and (relatedly) how changes in pictorial style can be accounted for through changes in these categories. Crucial to Panofsky’s account is that categories of form—for example the geometrically based theory of perspective which grounds (much) renaissance art—define pictorial schemes through which style becomes iterable (capable of repetition and variation according to the pattern), but also that these categories are achieved through history. While forms arise historically, their analytic reconstruction is transhistorical, like the synchronic reconstruction of language. Art history gives rise to transhistorical forms that can be given analytic reconstruction. It is this project (variously denoted as syntactic, semantic and logical) that Crowther is involved in elaborating. He is in this respect Panofsky’s student.

A style is bounded: a closed universe of types admitting of no alternatives. Crowther is, through Cassirer and Panofsky, neo-Kantian, and (to state what I take the key to this book to be) it follows that he is emphatically not Aristotelian or Wittgensteinian about style. Style is no loose aggregate of forms, linked together in terms of multiple criss-crossings or family resemblances, with potentially innumerable additions. A style is a systematic schema through which a two-dimensional surface can project figure-and-ground relationships, and thus signify pictorially. What is boldly and emphatically behind this book’s opposition to many current tendencies in art historical thought (and the humanities generally) is its claim to limn these various closed schemata, once and for all, and to prove that the variations one in fact finds within styles (renaissance, abstract, etc.) are encompassed by the determinate categories that comprise each schema. Schemes are stylistic essences, even if they are achieved through history and may have in some cases historical endpoints (meaning they have passed out of actual art-making).

The second component to Crowther’s style of analytic reconstruction is the claim that the determination of a stylistic essence (i.e. a schema for a type of picturing) allows for the reconstruction of the field of actual pictorial examples (of perspectival painting, abstraction—whatever) to show how this field can be clearly denoted and explained as falling under the stylistic type. The kind of analytic reconstruction offered in this book is closer in spirit to German idealism (the Hegel of the Logic whose reconstructions of empirical history prove them logically/dialectically necessary as fields of thought) than to analytical philosophy. It is fascinating to see such analysis resuscitated and, in some places, expertly employed.

The problem with this book for a reader like myself is that one comes away from it with the nagging suspicion that many of Crowther’s attempts to provide a determinate set of categories (logically necessary for a kind of pictorial style) are ad hoc. One felt this about his idealist predecessors as well. This is the kind of book that does not solicit engagement but accord. It is as if Crowther is lecturing on the basis of having solved everything, and one feels that his choices of categories and examples always conceal alternatives—and do so without adequate acknowledgment. For example the author claims that abstract picturing comes (and must come) in exactly four kinds, corresponding to four logical possibilities:

(1) The visual details of possible things, states of affairs, or like forms, which are unavailable to perception under normal circumstances … .
(2) Possible objects, events or life forms from or existing in alternative possible physical and perceptual environments to our own.
(3) Configurations arising from radical modes of schematizing, decomposing or recomposing material bodies or states of affairs.
(4) Possible visual traces of an item’s or state of affairs’ past, future or counterfactual appearances or positions. (148)

From this logically given set of possibilities, Crowther then derives (again without argument) the kinds of abstract pictorial styles that these possibilities analytically generate, and these (don’t you know it) turn out to more or less range over the history of abstract art in the twentieth century. He ends the chapter by claiming he has provided a theory of meaning for abstract art (even though nothing about actual content is specified in what he has putatively done). There is a certain obsessive elegance in his position. However, it is not difficult to imagine other ways, beyond Crowther’s canonical four, in which abstract picturing is possible. For example, consider a possible schema for the abstract picturing of human moods, another (or is it the same?) for poetic correspondences, another for sublimity, etc. Crowther could retort that these modes of picturing fall under (or are derivatives from) his list of 1-4. But I think he could only assert this on pain of making each of his propositions so vague as to encompass everything at the price of saying little or nothing.

Earlier in the book Crowther argues that the fundamental categories of art history encompass form, history and psychology, but his elaboration refuses ideology, society and economy for no particular reason that I can find, beyond his own explanatory preferences. It is an odd sin of omission given that the field of art history has (as he knows well) been highly preoccupied with demonstrating the importance of ideology, gender and the like for pictorial forms. What is right and indeed excellent in Crowther’s work is the return to the thought that forms as general as perspective cannot be reducible to ideological analysis, and that such forms do cry out to be understood along the lines of linguistic schemes, even if these analogies might not go the whole distance. However, it is not right to exclude economy, ideology and society without at least a serious exploration of what is at stake in style formation (especially while including psychology and history). What one misses in this book is the philosophy: the hard questioning of linguistic analogies, the hard thought about what counts as a style formation and its analytic reconstruction. One has the feeling Crowther had already made up his mind before writing the book, and that he is simply informing the reader of his opinions.

About twenty five years ago Kendall Walton wrote a paper called “Categories of Art”, which argued that categories of art arise and change in accord with temperaments of interpretation and indeed, new art-making. For this (and other) reasons, such categories are contingent and provisional—Aristotelian if you will. Some categories are far more central than others; others are perhaps essential (for this or that). But (and here is the Wittgensteinian element) all are revisable, insofar as their scope, and their place in a system or relationship with others can shift. Crowther says in passing that to understand a category is to understand it against the fabric of comparative categories, but little is made of the remark. Its implications are, in my view, vast. The concept of perspective shifts with Michelangelo and mannerism, it shifts against German expressionism and abstraction, and it shifts as concepts of theory in relationship to practice shift. The category also shifts as formal invention becomes increasingly recognized as an activity that takes shape in contexts of power and economy. The significance of these shifts is debatable. To mark a style is not to mark a system of determinate relationships between a fixed and complete number of categories (this precludes the crucial facts of revision and dissensus); it is, rather, to present a holistic representation which is always liable to change. A failure of Crowther’s book more than superficially related to his puristic, reconstructive style, is its near total absence of reference to about twenty-five years of debate in aesthetics, art history and art criticism (not to mention the philosophy of language and linguistics) about style, art, syntax and semantics. He writes against the ghosts of the 19th century, and this places him, curiously, in an anachronistic vacuum, even if it has the benefit of allowing him to pinpoint some of the ongoing importance of these great art historians from the past.