The Treatise on Human Nature: Summa Theologiae 1a 75-89

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Thomas Aquinas, The Treatise on Human Nature: Summa Theologiae 1a 75-89, translated by Robert Pasnau, Hackett, 2002, 434pp, $14.95 (pbk), ISBN 0872206130.

Reviewed by Eileen Sweeney, Boston College


This book offers a new translation of questions 75-89 of the first part of the Summa Theologiae. The translation is based on the Leonine edition of the text, to which emendations have been made. The text also includes a short introduction and fairly extensive commentary (about 200 pages, compared to 220 pages of translated text). There are eight appendices, which are translations of passages from other works of Aquinas which are important for the issues considered in questions 75-89. Several of these are passages from Aquinas's commentaries on Aristotle, especially De Anima; there are also passages from a crucial discussion of free choice in the Quaestiones Disputatae de Malo, and from a couple of biblical commentaries.

The book is clearly meant for undergraduate students. There is, for example a brief “Guide to Sources,” which gives the dates and one sentence descriptions of the major works and figures cited by Aquinas. The introduction assumes no knowledge of Aquinas's life or work and gives a very basic introduction to both. By giving the introduction, commentary, and other supplementary materials, the author is clearly seeking is make it worthwhile for teachers and students to purchase this volume when the most widely used translation, that of the Fathers of the English Dominican Province (Benzinger Brothers), is no longer under copyright and is available at a number of different web sites. The question is whether he succeeds. I think the answer is “yes” but with some qualifications.

I see the main value of the book in its commentary for introductory students rather than the translation itself. While it is true that the Leonine edition on which the Benzinger Brothers translation is based has many flaws, I don't find the changes Pasnau makes based on consultation of other manuscripts to be that significant, especially for beginning students. Further, the Dominican Fathers' translation is quite clear and not terribly old fashioned or jargon-filled. Pasnau's translation in the end is not that different. There is a reason why this is so: Aquinas's Latin is very dry, predictable, technical and clear. Hence, there aren't that many significant choices to be made by the translator, and Pasnau does not (and this is to his credit) make huge or systematic changes to the more standard translation of technical terms. He does have some helpful comments on technical terms (such as scientia, substantia, subsistens, intelligere, etc.) in the commentary portion.

There are some exceptions to this general characterization. For example, Pasnau translates liberum arbitrium as “free decision” rather than the more traditional “free choice.” He explains why he doesn't use “free will.” (p. 318) Quite rightly, Pasnau notes that there is in Aquinas's notion of “liberum arbitrium” an important cognitive element not captured by “free will” as a translation. What is puzzling is that there is no explanation of why he rejected the more usual “free choice” as a translation. Further, in the midst of the explanation, Pasnau wrongly characterizes the relationship between will (voluntas) and liberum arbitrium. For he claims that question 83 moves toward the conclusion that “free decision” is identical to the will. Hence, ultimately “free decision” could be translated as “free will” but to do that in the early articles would be, he argues, to presuppose that conclusion. This account obscures the very important distinction between will and free choice or decision in Aquinas. While both are acts of the same power, they are distinct acts. Will is the simple appetite for the end which is desired for its own sake; free choice is about the means to that end, not the end. We have free choice about the means but not about the end. Thus free choice and will are not identical for Aquinas. The problem here is not so much with the translation of “liberum arbitrium” as “free decision” but the explanation of that translation. The explanation is at least misleading, especially for students who are expecting to find in Aquinas a notion of “free will,” which is not there.

Another exception is the translation of “cognoscere” as “cognize” instead of “know.” No explanation of this choice is given where the term is used, though under the explanation of intelligere Pasnau refers the reader to appendix five, a translation from Aquinas's commentary on the Gospel of John. This passage contrasts the act of understanding (intelligere) and cognizing (cogitatio). Another example is the translation of “habitus” as “disposition.” In this case the choice of “disposition” over “habit” doesn't seem to accomplish much and might be confusing. It should be clear that Aquinas is using the Aristotelian notion of “habit,” which the translation of it as “disposition” obscures (unless the reader has read a translation of Aristotle that makes the same choice). Moreover, later in the Summa theologiae, Aquinas explicitly makes a distinction between habitus and dispositio (I-II q. 49, a. 2, ad 3). Habitus is a disposition that is not easily lost. Some of the changes Pasnau makes are valuable, however. For example, Pasnau renders passio as “passive alteration” rather than simply “passion.” This translation captures the sense of passio that beginning students might miss, given the modern sense of “passion.” Pasnau also translates “potentia” as “capacity,” which is more helpful to the beginning students than “power” because it clears up the ambiguity in the Latin term “potentia.” Pasnau's commentary explains his choice and makes clear what is gained and lost by it.

In many cases, Pasnau's explanations of technical terms in his commentary are just citations of Aquinas's own explanations of terms elsewhere in the text. This is accurate and helpful, but some terms need more clarification. One example is “species,” especially since this word is simply transferred from the Latin into English. Pasnau might have noted its connection to the Greek term eidos and the ways in which it is and is not like the more modern notions of idea or concept. Sometimes Pasnau shifts a traditional translation in order to correct a common misapprehension. Once again, this is often helpful, but sometimes though the clarification Pasnau adds in the commentary is quite good and accurate, the translation itself does not, as he seems to claim, make his point for him. For example, he translates the principle usually rendered “nature does nothing in vain” as “a natural desire cannot be pointless.” (p. 237) He argues that the traditional interpretation can be misunderstood as the claim that nature never gives a desire that cannot be fulfilled. Though I agree that what it means is that “nature always works for some purpose,” I don't see why Pasnau's translation obviates the misreading more than the older translation. Overall, I think a glossary of technical terms would have been a significant improvement to the text, especially if it included more than citations of Aquinas's definitions or explanations of technical terms.

The commentary does much more, however, than explain technical terms and scholastic principles. Pasnau also attempts to give brief explanatory sketches of the philosophical positions and issues Aquinas is debating. And again the majority of this material is helpful. For example, Pasnau gives a basic account of the views of human nature that Aquinas is arguing against, those of Averroes, Plato and the view that the soul has a multiplicity of forms. However, to explain the appeal of Averroes, Pasnau cites a passage from Emerson which seems to endorse some kind of monopsychism. (p. 245) While the passage is interesting, it is less effective than explaining some of the apparent grounds for such a position. Aquinas gives some of these grounds, of course, in the objections preceding his reply (1a q. 76, a. 2, obj. 1-5). Not all of these are convincing to contemporary readers, but there are several that point to the strongest grounds: the universality and commonality of knowledge which might be explained by a single source. In general, the commentary would be improved by using Aquinas' own objections as a way of showing the nature of each issue and its significance.

Pasnau also includes , again in a way that is helpful for beginning students, explanations of Aristotelian text and principles which Aquinas draws on. He also explains more obscure technical distinctions, for example, the difference between two different types of per se predication. (p. 249) Pasnau is also refreshingly direct in questioning dubious claims or arguments Aquinas makes when he does not think they can be defended. So, for example, he calls Aquinas's claim (originally found in Aristotle) that “those with soft flesh are mentally well fit” preposterous (p. 254), and he also notes the difficulty of figuring out what Aquinas and Aristotle mean by the claim that “the intellect cannot be false.” The commentary avoids taking for granted the clarity or truth of Aquinas's claims and principles, and gives admirably brief and clear explanations of the most likely and strongest arguments in their favor.

Pasnau states at the outset that he has “made strenuous efforts to avoid tendentious remarks that reflect [his] own idiosyncratic readings of the text.” Instead his aim is “to point out areas of controversy and uncertainty, without [himself] taking a stand on the appropriate interpretation.” (p. xxi). Pasnau works hard to keep this promise. The commentary points the reader to secondary literature on controversial issues or in cases where there is a long and complicated medieval controversy to which Aquinas is responding. In such contexts, Pasnau always gives multiple references, often explicitly noting that those sources take opposing views. More importantly, Pasnau does not take a view on issues he takes to be unsettled. For example, he does not say whether or in what sense Aquinas thinks of sensation as merely material alteration, nor whether or in what sense Aquinas might be a kind of dualist (though not a “substance-dualist” like Descartes). On the other hand, there is a deeper sense in which the commentary puts forward a certain way of reading Aquinas, and a certain way of constructing the philosophical issues with which it is concerned. Pasnau's style of explanation and references to secondary literature are generally in the analytic tradition. By this I mean two things. First, I mean that the way Pasnau glosses the issues and arguments Aquinas puts forward uses the method of close linguistic and logical analysis that are hallmarks of philosophers working in the analytic style. Second, I mean that the issues highlighted in the commentary are those that would tend to put Aquinas in dialogue with an analytic philosophy of mind. Both of these perspectives have great advantages because they don't, as earlier commentaries have, simply take for granted the positions and principles Aquinas stakes out, nor do they, as for example Gilson's reading of Aquinas's epistemology does, construe Aquinas as a response to Descartes and Kant. The criticism I have of Pasnau's commentary is not so much that it has a perspective but that he takes his reading to be neutral, when it is not.

Also, perhaps out of a desire to make Aquinas appear “philosophical” to contemporary readers, the commentary tends to gloss over theological and Neo-platonic elements of the text. For example, the commentary does not in any way address the role of scripture in the text. Most beginning students assume that Aquinas is using scripture to prove the points he wants to make or at least that he allows scripture to dictate the positions he ultimately defends. Neither are the case, but the role it does play is surely larger than window dressing, which is what Pasnau's non-consideration of it implies. The most telling comment comes during Pasnau's discussion of Aquinas's consideration of the knowledge of the separated soul, where he asserts that this part of the Summa theologiae, in contrast to Part III (what he thinks about Part II is unclear) “relies only on principles that can be rationally defended outside a specifically Christian framework.” (p. 369) The implication is that we may dispense with the theological elements of the text and may safely consider it as “philosophy” in the modern sense.

Where I find the commentary least helpful is in guiding students through what the author acknowledges is a difficult philosophical genre. The brief introduction gives the basic structure of the abbreviated form of the disputed question Aquinas uses here. But apart from giving some different strategies for reading the articles out of order as a way of making Aquinas's views a little easier to discern, Pasnau offers no more explanation. Within the commentary, Pasnau often precedes his discussion of each article with a “yes” or “no” in response to the question posed by that article. This may help beginning students trying to get a beginning foothold in that article, but it is a little like citing the conclusions of Socrates' arguments rather than paying attention to how he gets there. Both in the introduction and the commentary Pasnau attempts to get around and minimize the disadvantages of the form rather than show its philosophical value and interest.

In the end, I would recommend use of the book in courses on philosophical anthropology or epistemology. The commentary is certainly more helpful than anything else available (or even out of print) for beginning students. The form and language of the Summa theologiae is so foreign to contemporary students and teachers, and this edition goes a long way toward making both accessible. While I might have wished for an access that brought contemporary students closer to Aquinas's language and methods rather than an exegesis that brings Aquinas closer to contemporary ways and means of approaching these issues, Pasnau makes an admirable and often successful attempt to accomplish the latter.