The Trope Bundle Theory of Substance: Change, Individuation and Individual Essence

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Márta Ujvári, The Trope Bundle Theory of Substance: Change, Individuation and Individual Essence, Ontos, 2013, 251pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381801.

Reviewed by Roxanne Marie Kurtz, University of Illinois Springfield


In this ambitious conceptual reduction of things into tropes, Márta Ujvári seeks to articulate, motivate, and defend a novel two-tier modal trope bundle theory as the best explanation of the nature of individual substances like persons, statues, and portions of clay. (I'll refer to individual substances as things or concreta.) She combines essentialist, endurantist, and one-thinger commitments with her tropism to arrive at an account on which things are concrete particulars that may persist through change and serve as subjects of contingent predication. An essentialist holds that some things have some properties necessary for their existence. An endurantist maintains that some things are wholly present at different times. A one-thinger contends that numerically distinct objects cannot fully share the same space-time region.[1] Her ontology is not a pure tropism. It includes abstract particulars, independent concrete particulars, and genuine universal relations.

Peter Simons' perdurantist two-tier modal trope bundle theory significantly influences Ujvári's own account. But she diverges from his position in important respects. First, she retains the traditional view of tropes on which they are abstracta rather than concreta. For, she suggests that if we allow them to be concreta, we lose the metaphysical motivation for countenancing enduring entities in addition to perduring entities.[2] But, coherent accounts of change and identity through time require enduring entities. (Of course, this leads her to reject Simons' perdurantism as well.) Second, she seeks a metaphysics that allows things to have incompatible determinate properties at different times. In this way, her approach makes things less fragile with respect to such changes than they would be on Simons' view. A determinate property is a refinement of a relatively broader determinable property. For instance, being red is a determinate with respect to having a color, while being red is a determinable with respect to the determinate of being brick red. Her revision of how we should understand the place of determinate and determinable properties in the structured trope bundle allows things to survive changes to their determinate properties, such as a tomato changing from green to red as it ripens.

Ujvári suggests that her book suits both metaphysician colleagues and graduate students working in analytic metaphysics. With respect to its philosophical content, I agree that it has much to offer these audiences. First, it is a non-superficial survey and critical assessment of several approaches to concreta in current analytic philosophy. She engages with a number of pressing issues in contemporary analytic metaphysics that challenge other tropist or bundle views with an eye toward preserving the strengths and sidestepping the pitfalls of these competing positions. Second, Ujvári's trope bundle theory carves out a unique space among its opponents that warrants attention. But, for reasons I touch upon at this end of this review, I find that the presentation of the material unnecessarily frustrates my attempts to reap the full benefits of its philosophical utility. That being said, for those with serious interest in tropism, the content remains valuable even if they share my wish that it were easier to extract.

Here I aim to get a rough version of Ujvári's view on the table as I understand it. My sketch, though, does not come close to capturing the subtlety or complexity of her positive position nor the several interwoven arguments she employs in its defense.

On Ujvári's account, a trope is a momentary, unrepeatable, abstract property particular (not a particularized property) individuated by reference to the thing that is its unique bearer. So, tropes can neither exist independently of nor be transferred between their bearers. For instance, although we share a similar feature, my daughter's freckled nosed-ness trope can only belong to her, and mine to me. Each trope has a spatiotemporal location, but as abstracta, tropes may spatiotemporally coincide. So, we may not individuate a trope by its spatiotemporal location. Moreover, despite having spatiotemporal locations, tropes fall into the category of abstracta because (i) their existence depends upon the existence of those things to which they belong and (ii) they cannot bear a manifold of qualitative features.

Ujvári suggests that things are enduring concrete particulars individuated by reference to their bundle of tropes and unique spatiotemporal locations. Things are concreta only if (i) their existence is independent from other particulars, (ii) they bear a manifold of qualitative features, and (iii) they have spatiotemporal locations. Ujvári directly confronts the appearance of circular individuation -- it might appear that we must individuate tropes by things that are themselves individuated by tropes. She develops a view of independence as an emergent property of things that allows us to individuate them without direct reference to tropes.

The modal structure of the trope bundle lies at the heart of Ujvári's position. The trope bundle is not a mere unstructured collection, set, or fusion of tropes. Rather, momentary abstract tropes that stand in the proper gluing or foundation relation(s) of variable polyadicity form a cohesive unity such that some tropes are more tightly bound in an essential core surrounded by an outer fringe of accidental tropes. In this way it is a two-tier modal account. The bundle's internal modal structure allows for a robust notion of change as the enduring thing can have incompatible tropes in the fringy parts of its bundle at different times. The essentialist core allows for contingent predication as the "thin" thing can serve as a substratum-like subject.

On Ujvári's view, we may understand many properties as classes of tropes. A particular shade of red is just a class of exactly resembling tropes, for instance. But such properties are not genuine immanent or transcendent universals in which a unique property is repeatedly instantiated. So, she is not a realist about properties. But, neither does she count herself a nominalist. On a nominalist view, properties would be mere classes of concreta. On her view, the derivative existence of properties hinges on abstract property particulars (tropes, of course).

However, unlike pure tropist theorists, she finds that tropists cannot get all the relations (or even properties) they need so easily. In particular, she makes space in her ontology for genuine repeatable universals to explain relations of compresence (the gluing/foundation relations) and resemblance, and at least some "universal-susceptible" determinable properties.

Ujvári counts events as tropes and thus as abstract particulars. She acknowledges that events can be four-dimensional entities that occupy space-time regions, but argues that they nevertheless fail to count as concreta (see especially 70-80 on this point). Because of concerns shared with other endurantists, she rejects the idea that perduring four-dimensional particulars can play the role of individual substances in coherent accounts of change and contingent predication. Once she counts events as tropes, the ontology of events is a key motivation for her to count tropes as abstracta rather than concreta. For, if we allow four-dimensional events to exist as concreta, then we lose important grounds for insisting upon a deep metaphysical distinction between events and things.

If successful, Ujvári's view would arguably deliver the benefits she suggests, some of which are:

  • Because qualitative features matter to the individuation of things, we avoid the anti-essentialism of bare substrata views on which qualitative features cannot matter to the individuation of things because as propertiless entities, bare substrata cannot necessitate any qualitative features.
  • The two-tier modality allows us to avoid the problem of things being too fragile with respect to change that comes with the ultra-essentialism of single-tier bundle theories.
  • The tropism allows us to make sense of empirically qualitatively identical objects (like some spinning spheres) that remain numerically distinct. For, two things may have exactly resembling tropes, but due to bearer uniqueness of tropes, we have a ready metaphysical explanation for their distinctness.
  • We keep the motivation for an ontology that includes enduring objects in addition to any perduring entities we might allow.
  • Perhaps most important, we get an account of things that works well for both robust accounts of change and contingent predication.

I raise here two worries. First, it seems to me that Ujvári makes metaphysical concessions where she need not do so because of an unnecessary attachment to one-thingism. Second, I worry that her arguments meant to persuade us that we need individual essences for explanations will leave even those readers friendly to essentialism unmoved.

As to the first, Ujvári leaves me wondering: What's so bad about a multi-thinger two-tier modal trope bundle theory? Of course, such an approach is at odds with Ujvári's one-thingism: she denies the coherence of numerically distinct but coincident things. But consider that her one-thinger ontology yields two unfortunate consequences. First, it forces her to accept the fragility of sortals with respect to Cambridge change. Second, it leads her to adopt the metaphysically dubious notion of relative identity when confronted with cases like a statue made of clay. (See especially 199-216 on these concerns.)

If we allow a multi-thinger approach, then we may appeal to the relation of material constitution to avoid both of these uncomfortable consequences. First, contrary to Ujvári, we may very well be able to use constitution to block the threat to sortal essentialism posed by Cambridge change that arises on a one-thinger view.[3]  Second,  we may maintain a commitment to strict identity even if we allow for statues to be distinct from hunks of clay that constitute them.

Perhaps Ujvári's opposition to multi-thingism traces to a concern with maintaining coherency within her tropism. If so, I am not clear as to why that would be the case. She allows for the existence of distinct coinciding tropes and both sortal and individual essentialism. Within such a framework, it seems to me that we can make room for coincident concreta after all. Ujvári individuates concreta by appeal to the structured bundle of abstract tropes together with a reference to a unique spatiotemporal location. Let us agree that when a thing exists, it will occupy a unique spatiotemporal location -- it must be some place and the whole thing cannot be in two places at once.[4] But, why may we not allow two concreta to be in one place at once?

Recall that distinct abstract tropes may coincide. So, perhaps we may have coincident tropes that belong to different bearers. In such a case, distinct structured bundles of abstract tropes could coincide, and so distinct essential cores that involve both sortal and individual essences could likewise coincide. If we individuate things by appeal to spatiotemporal location and trope bundles with rich essences, then it seems to me that we may have two things in one place at one time. For instance, we may have a statue constituted by a numerically distinct hunk of clay.[5]

Arguably such a multi-thinger tropism respects the principles of bearer uniqueness and non-transferability that Ujvári views as key to any successful trope theory. And, it seems to me that both the statue and the clay meet the criteria for things as described by Ujvári. Each occupies a spatiotemporal location and bears a manifold of qualitative features. Thus, I would urge that Ujvári clarify her commitment to one-thingism and whether and/or why she deems it necessary for the coherence of her tropist account of things.

As to my second worry, while sympathetic to Ujvári's position that we have good reasons to allow for individual essences in virtue of their importance to successful individuation of substances and to explanations of their persistence conditions, she fails to make her case. She excludes from essences some properties to which others have appealed in a quest for a successful account of individual essences, such as origin properties, haecceities, and trivial properties such as being self-identical with a bearer substance. Rather than these more familiar ways to explain individual essences, Ujvári seeks an account of individual essences that invokes only pure properties undetermined by sortal essences. Unfortunately, I found her examples unconvincing.

On my understanding, her strategy to inspire a commitment to individual essences is to say: "Look, we have two good lines of argument to support the postulation of qualitative individual essences even if I can't tell you exactly what they are." One line is this: If we agree that we have good reasons to believe that events have individual essences, then analogous reasons should lead us to believe that things have individual essences.[6] I set this line to the side.

My interest is with her second line of argument: Ujvári holds that we require individual essences to avoid an explanatory gap when it comes to our ability to provide complete metaphysical explanations of what is and is not possible for concrete particulars. The suggestion is that limits on modal possibilities for given individuals do not trace to sortal essences and accidental features alone. So, to explain such modal constraints, we must appeal to qualitative individual essences in at least some cases.

To illustrate the need for individual essences, Ujvári shares that it is impossible for her to be a champion basketball player because of some "idiosyncratic features" that she has as an individual, such as being clumsy with balls and uncooperative as a team member. The relevant idiosyncratic features are compatible with, yet not determined by, whatever sortal essence(s) she has (like being a human). So, to offer a full explanation of why she cannot be a basketball champion, we must appeal to those features directly.

Consider one sort of explanation. We might think that her reported clumsiness and uncooperativeness are accidental. If so, we could explain her limited possibilities in sports by an appeal to the relevant accidental features she has that make shooting hoops professionally beyond her reach. In her terms, on this view it would be actually not possible for her.

And now here is where the purported explanatory gap arises that requires a different sort of explanation. If Ujvári's idiosyncratic features were merely accidental, then our powers of explanation would be limited to accounting for why it is actually not possible for her to shoot hoops professionally. But she contends that we must explain a stronger claim, because she holds the stronger claim that it is not possibly possible for her to shoot hoops professionally. For, if she contends that if she were to lose those idiosyncratic features, then she would cease to exist in virtue of losing at least one essential property. If so, then a full explanation as to why she cannot be a basketball player would require appeal to those essential features that she has as an individual over and above those that come with her sortal essence(s).

To make her case, Ujvári must convince us that at least some of her idiosyncratic features are essential to her existence rather than mere accidents. She asks us to believe that skill set and attitudes are among the relevant idiosyncratic features that are essential to individuals. But, aren't these just the sort of things that could change over time without threatening one's identity? My sister, for instance, has become quite sporty in recent years, unlike her earlier self. She has newfound abilities and a different outlook toward sweat-inducing activities. But, she remains my big sister. I have not the slightest inkling that such changes threaten her existence. In another example, Ujvári urges us to consider that Socrates' moral character was essential to him. But again, I find my intuitions go in the opposite direction -- it seems to me that accidental circumstances around his upbringing could have instilled in the numerically identical Socrates a very different moral character.

Thus, I conclude that Ujvári has not yet demonstrated the explanatory gap to which she appeals to defend a need for us to postulate individual essences. This is worrying. She denies making an attempt at an ontological reduction of things. Rather, her project is meant to be a conceptual reduction of things driven by what it takes to make our explanations of the world work. In the argument just sketched, she seems to insist on a kind of explanation that we can do without. So, perhaps her view can do without individual essences as she construes them.

Use of this book in a philosophically fruitful manner would be significantly enhanced by the addition of an index and usable internal cross-references, the clarification of the task for each chapter and the judicious use of sections within those chapters, greater guidance to the reader to make the argument structure and takeaways more transparent, less elliptical arguments, more illustrative examples, fewer shifts in terminology, and revisions to the prose to eliminate errors in grammar and cumbersome constructions. Nevertheless, Ujvári's novel account and her exploration of the debate surrounding the nature of things remains a useful contribution to the literature in contemporary analytic metaphysics.

[1] In contrast, multi-thingers deny this claim. For instance, given a statue made entirely from a hunk of clay at time t, a one-thinger holds that the statue and clay must be numerically identical at t, while a multi-thinger allows that they may be numerically distinct at t.

[2] The ontology of event particulars plays an important role in this line of argument.

[3] Ujvári argues that an appeal to constitution cannot solve the Dion/Theon puzzle. I find her argument problematic. In particular, I reject the claim that a proper part of a person’s body is essentially a proper part of the person.

[4] I don’t mean to deny the existence of scattered objects that may exist in a scattered spatiotemporal location.

[5] The high degree of similarity between the statue and clay ought not trouble Ujvári. She holds that it is a virtue of her view that it allows for qualitative duplicates that have all exactly resembling, but distinct, tropes (as in spinning sphere cases.) Statue and clay would, presumably, be far less similar.

[6] The idea seems to be that we can’t make sense of singular event causation unless we postulate the individual essences of events. So we should accept those essences. Likewise, we can’t make sense of the events understood as “triples with continuants, properties and times” unless we postulate the individual essences of continuants. So she urges that we should accept those essences, too.