The Truth (and Untruth) of Language: Heidegger, Ricoeur and Derrida on Disclosure and Displacement

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Gert-Jan van der Heiden, The Truth (and Untruth) of Language: Heidegger, Ricoeur and Derrida on Disclosure and Displacement, Duquesne University Press, 2010, 296pp, $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780820704340.

Reviewed by Karl Simms, University of Liverpool


Van der Heiden's project is deceptively modest: to understand how Heidegger, Ricoeur and Derrida address poetic language and truth through the twin concepts of disclosure and displacement. This, of course, already presupposes much: that truth is to be found in poetic language rather than any other sort (scientific, propositional, etc.), and that the concepts of disclosure and displacement are central to discerning a certain commonality of purpose between these three thinkers.

Van der Heiden's book is organised into four principal chapters: 'Heidegger on Disclosure and Language', 'The Transference of Writing', 'Inventions of Metaphor', and 'Mimesis in Myth and Translation'. In the first, he reminds us that for Heidegger, Being arrives to Dasein in a state of unconcealedness (alētheia), but that metaphysics from Plato on has veiled the way whereby Being brings its unconcealedness with it. In Sein und Zeit, the 'fundamental phenomenon of truth' is 'the disclosedness of Dasein' (p. 46), and on this rests a conception of language that is 'apophantic', which is to say, it reveals beings (to themselves), rather than representing the world. This apophantic, or showing, character of language is dependent on Dasein's disclosedness. In his later work, Heidegger turns towards the essence of language and in so doing sees language as the origin of disclosure itself, rather than being derivative of it. Along the way, Heidegger rejects the project (associated with Frege and the analytic tradition) of producing an unambiguous computable metalanguage: such a metalanguage by definition cannot find truth as disclosure within the heart of language itself, as a lived experience. By the same token Heidegger also rejects everyday speaking which, through its forgetting of the originarily authentic in its adoption of cliché and idle talk, does not bring language to language itself. This bringing of language to language can only be achieved, according to Heidegger, through poetic language, leading him to readings of Stefan George and Hölderlin as exemplars of poets who unconceal the essence of language to beings. Heidegger thus privileges Ereignis, the event whereby the appropriate word is said in poetry as an unconcealment of truth and reality. The essence of language is this poetic Sage, saying.

This leads Heidegger to a dismissal of writing as a displacement of this Sage, a displacement which conceals the essence of language. Thus disclosure and displacement are the two opposing poles which delimit the field of Heidegger's enquiry into language: disclosure as the unconcealment of language's essence and displacement as its concealment. It is at this point that van der Heiden sees Ricoeur and Derrida as engaging with Heidegger, both in accepting his premises regarding the alētheic nature of language, and in rejecting the opposition he establishes between writing and authentic saying. Ricoeur, we recall, appropriates and radicalises Gadamer's notion of distanciation. For Ricoeur, writing entails a fourfold distanciation. Firstly, it partakes of the distanciation common to any form of discourse, that between event and signification. What a piece of discourse means can always in principle be distanced from the event of its being articulated: I can have a conversation on a certain topic one day and tell a third party about it on another day. The second form of distanciation is peculiar to writing, in that a written text may be distanced from its explicit addressee, if it has one: 'the text addresses everyone who can read' (p.79). Thirdly, writing distances from the world, insofar as in hearing speech I understand meaning directly, whereas writing draws attention to its structure, form, genre and so on. What is significant about this for Ricoeur is that through this suspension of the world, written text is able to present an imaginary or fictive world: fiction refigures and redescribes the world we inhabit (it is not clear from Ricoeur's account, or from van der Heiden's summary of it, why the stories produced by oral cultures do not enjoy the same privilege). And fourthly, writing distances self from self, as when we 'lose ourselves' in a book. Contrary to Gadamer, who held that we impose our Vor-urteile (pre-judgements or prejudices) on texts, for Ricoeur we expose ourselves to texts. Texts increase the interpreter's understanding of the world while exposing his or her illusions.

What these four modes of distanciation have in common is dialectic: between event and signification, between intended addressee and actual addressee, between actual world and fictive world, and between prejudiced self and understanding self. It is van der Heiden's contention that these four dialectics are variations on the theme of just one: between disclosure and displacement. Distanciation is the form of displacement peculiar to writing, in which is played out a dialectic whereby what would be hitherto concealed -- the self whom the text addresses and who thereby gains a deeper understanding of his being-in-the-world -- is disclosed. Put this way, Ricoeur's simultaneous debt to and departure from Heidegger is demonstrated: for Ricoeur, fictive works, like Heidegger's poetic language, reveal the world at a more profound level, but unlike Heidegger (and Gadamer, who follows him), Ricoeur sees the text's being-written as being inimical to this revelation, rather than being an obstacle to the authenticity of being in language.

What, then, of Derrida? Van der Heiden reprises various canonical Derrida texts (including 'Plato's Pharmacy' and his Introduction to Husserl's The Origin of Geometry) to remind us that for Derrida, writing is originarily a supplement that is characteristic of language as such, a supplement that is necessary in order to act as a placeholder for a consciousness that would guarantee the ideality of any discourse. In the case of geometrical objects, for example, writing supplements the consciousness of the form of the object in order to let it appear. For Derrida, this is essential to the structure of any expressing whatever: 'no expressing is a simple bringing to presence of a being', writes van der Heiden, because 'every expressing is always also a supplement' (p. 101). As with Ricoeur, there is a similarity and a difference with Heidegger here. Like Heidegger, Derrida believes that no being can appear without language and that language brings being to presence out of concealment. However, for Derrida, this trace-structure of writing is unavoidably primary; it is not something that can be set aside in favour of a somehow authentic saying that can present being directly.

Van der Heiden discerns a similar relationship between Ricoeur and Heidegger, and between Derrida and Heidegger, when it comes to the concepts of metaphor, and of myth and translation also. In the case of metaphor, van der Heiden jumps straight to the central point (avoiding his detours through I. A. Richards, Max Black, Roman Jakobson et al.) of Ricoeur's La métaphore vive: in a metaphor X is Y, X simultaneously is and is not Y. The apprehender of the metaphor understands this potential contradiction as an oscillation between the two positions, encapsulated in the formula X is as Y. The as here represents the moment of interpretation; according to van der Heiden, it represents an attempt to overcome the dynamic (the oscillation between the is and is not) of metaphor on the part of the comprehending being. Again, this points out a difference between Ricoeur and Heidegger -- essentially the same difference as was discerned in the discussion of language as such. For Ricoeur, the 'being as being-as' of poetic discourse (which is where metaphors abound) is a disclosure of how things truly are, but this disclosure is speculative and focused on the ontology of the X. For Heidegger, meanwhile, the 'being-as' obscures the identity; metaphor implies that the X can never be disclosed as such, but only as co-belonging with the Y. The speculative act of interpretation (of a metaphor) is essentially metaphysical, and therefore anti-ontological, for Heidegger. Derrida's twist on this is to claim that Heidegger fails to escape the phenomenon he describes. In attempting to find the essence of Being as such, Heidegger names Being as if it were a being. The as of this as if is, according to Derrida, a 'quasi-metaphorical' as, functioning in the same way as the as of metaphor. Hence Heidegger's passage from a critique of metaphor to an examination of what is proper to Being is really a movement from anti-metaphorics to quasi-metaphorics.

As with metaphor, so also with mimesis and translation. Derrida draws attention to the two Western traditions of mimesis: the Platonic, whereby mimesis signifies the presentation of the thing itself, and the Aristotelian, whereby mimesis sets up a relation of homoiōsis between two terms. Clearly this second definition of mimesis is very close, also, to Aristotle's definition of metaphor, and in this respect Ricoeur's conception of mimesis is indebted to it. Derrida's point is that both traditions of mimesis are in the service of truth, although van der Heiden finds Derrida's argument justifying this of the homoiōsis type sketchy. Notwithstanding, this again reveals both a similarity and a difference between Derrida and Ricoeur: or rather, they arrive at similar positions via different routes. For Derrida, mimesis is a supplement to nature that allows it to come to presence by adding an absence, the absence of its own being. For Ricoeur, only a partial understanding of the nature of being and the being of nature is possible, to be arrived at by the agglomeration of various incomplete configurations. As van der Heiden pithily puts it, 'Ontology remains the promised land that hermeneutics will never enter' (p. 221).

Ultimately, Ricoeur and Derrida also agree on what is important about translation: that it shows that language is originarily multiple (and therefore that this multiplicity is, contra Heidegger, part of the essence of language while questioning the very concept of essence in this context); that it constitutes the hospitality of language; and that translation is a work of mourning and of memory (mourning the loss of an original idiom; remembering the babelisation that has interrupted it). And Ricoeur and Derrida alike grasp that translation, too, is a form of mimesis (something that was lost on Heidegger).

Van der Heiden's book, then, offers a way of seeing the relationship of both Ricoeur and Derrida to Heidegger, and hence the relationship between Ricoeur and Derrida, in terms of a conception of truth as disclosure and displacement. In this journey of revealing, it takes many paths, sometimes parallel, sometimes crossing one another. This is a hermeneutic and heuristic journey, rather than a philosophical argument as such, but it is one that arrives at a new and productive understanding of Ricoeur's and Derrida's indebtedness to Heidegger.