The Twenty-Five Years of Philosophy: A Systematic Reconstruction

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Eckart Förster, The Twenty-Five Years of Philosophy: A Systematic Reconstruction, Harvard University Press, 2012, 432pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674055162.

Reviewed by Terry Pinkard, Georgetown University


The philosophical movement that started with Kant, then went through Reinhold, Fichte, Schelling and Hegel has proven to be one of the most contentious in philosophical history, and how you narrate it probably reveals a lot about your own philosophical inclinations. One way of telling the story is to see Kant as founding a powerful way of doing philosophy that still calls for development and then dismissing what happens after that as not only a fundamental misunderstanding of Kant but also as the world turned upside down. Another way takes Kant to have laid some essential cornerstones for a grand edifice and the movement afterwards as marching inexorably to its conclusion in Hegel, who finally completes the cathedral (only to be told by Nietzsche that God is dead and so we don't need cathedrals any more). Or, as some still do, one can see the movement as indeed inexorable in its march but to draw the moral it is best never to inhale any of the Kantian stuff in the first place since it can only lead you inevitably to ruin. Moreover, lots of philosophers and non-philosophers feel that they have a lot at stake in how that sequence is narrated, and they are ready to pounce on what they see as any deviation in "the important part" of the story. Specialists in each of the figures are poised, ready to jump on any slight deviation from what they take to be the true view of their own special figure. And there's always the: Why didn't you mention so-and-so, who was critical to the debate? There are by now a kaleidoscopic variety of "this is what really happened" accounts of this development. Do we need one more?

There are clear pitfalls for anybody entering into such a contentious area. On the other hand, Eckart Förster, who has already contributed such an illustrious variety of textual, systematic and historical studies to this literature might seem perfectly suited to such a task. Happily, his book does not disappoint.

The book's title is a philosophical jest based on two quotations: in 1781, Kant said in effect that prior to his own critical philosophy, there had been no real philosophy, and in 1806 Hegel said in effect that now philosophy had reached its end. Taken literally, that would mean that according to Kant and Hegel, the history of philosophy only had twenty-five years to its credit. So what did philosophy do with its time in those twenty-five years of its short life? Förster's book is the answer.

The amount of material covered by Förster is impressive, and, just as he has to ignore some things in order to have a readable narrative, a shorter review has to ignore even more detail to fit the space limits. This is a shame, since Förster's book is rich in specificity.

One of Förster's big ideas in the book is that within the development of Kant's philosophy in his three Critiques, there is a dynamic at work which culminates in a distinction which becomes clear only after the third Critique, namely, that between "intellectual intuition" and "intuitive intellect." Furthermore, so Förster argues, Kant makes this distinction only in light of a series of conceptual and historical factors that have been for the most part overlooked, and that it is not only this distinction that motivates much of what occurs after Kant, but in particular, it is crucial to what is taken up by Goethe in his treatment of the "metamorphosis of plants" which in turn propels Hegel to fashion his own "dialectical" style of philosophy. What is the distinction? An "intellectual intuition" would be the thought of something that in thinking its object produces its object. As every reader of Kant knows, Kant thinks that although we can conceive of such an intuition, any such intellectual intuition is impossible for human finite knowers who must combine intellectual concepts with the givens of pure and sensuous intuition. (An intellectual intuition would collapse possibility and actuality into each other. We discursive creatures cannot do that.) An intuitive intellect, on the other hand, would be an intellect that proceeded from the whole to the parts and which recognized no contingencies in the way the parts are related to the whole. In the case of intellectual intuition, the basic contrast is between the receptive and the spontaneous, whereas in the case of the intuitive intellect, the basic contrast is between the intuitive and the discursive. They are both Kantian ideas, they are both different from each other, and the differences have been by and large overlooked by commentators.

Kant is driven to this by the fact that when he began the first Critique, he thought that the basic question had to do with the nature of the relation of a priori representations to objects. However, as his work progressed and as he later remarked to his students, he decided en route that his work was really about the possibility of synthetic a priori judgments. As Kant began to worry about how to treat morality and then taste, the stress on the possibility of synthetic a priori judgments took over. However, throughout the development Kant insisted that the goal of philosophy was to become a science, and he himself indicated in places that the scientific status for philosophy demanded that there be a single first principle from which all else could in some way be derived.

If so, what would be that first principle from which spontaneity, receptivity, the categorical imperative, etc. could be derived? Kant himself didn't say, but there were others ready to fill in the gap. In the 1780's, Reinhold proposed that it was the concept of representation in general. In the 1790's, Fichte, making good on some infelicities in Reinhold's proposed system, proposed that it was the "I" that formed the first principle, and this "I" formed itself in an intellectual intuition. Around the same time, however, the star poet-scientist-government functionary, Goethe, inspired by Spinoza (who had been put back into the Kantian debate by Jacobi) proposed a different conception for a "scientific" philosophy: It would, on Spinoza's proposal, derive the nature of a thing from its essence (or "definition"). Once Goethe had read Kant's third Critique, he realized that he himself had been proposing an "intuitive science" that would work first of all intuitively from the parts to the whole and then, on the basis of that intuition, derive the parts from its intuitive grasp of the whole. Thus, whereas Fichte claimed science to rest in the intellectual intuition of the "I," Goethe claimed that it rested on the intuitive understanding of the "Idea" of things. If Fichte's Wissenschaftslehre claimed to be the proof of the reliance on intellectual intuition, then Goethe's treatise on the metamorphosis of plants claimed to be the proof that there was such a thing as an intuitive intellect. (Förster's account here is a new interpretation of a critical period and what ideas lay behind the intellectual ferment.)

In the 1790's, Schelling came on the scene inspired by but disgruntled with all of this. He rejected Kant's conclusion that the contradiction between mechanism and teleology lay in the conditions of our own discursive thought, and he rejected Kant's own way out of the antinomy (that is, he rejected the way that Kant saved, for example, freedom by appealing to its practical necessity and its noumenal unknowability). However, he saw Fichte's proposal to eliminate the thing-in-itself and look instead only to the relation between the "I" and the "Not-I" to be too subjective. If Kant was right in the third Critique when he said that the experience of natural beauty gave us the indeterminate concept of the supersensible substrate of both nature and freedom, then, so Schelling reasoned, if we reject the sharp noumenal/phenomenal distinction, we at least should have some way of discussing that substrate, and Spinoza's philosophy suggested itself as just that way. We should think of nature in Spinoza's terms: as a productive force that solidifies itself into determinate structures. Putting that into a post-Kantian context brings one to Schelling's Naturphilosophie, in which, instead of Fichte's conception of the "I" becoming an object to itself, we have a conception of nature itself becoming an object to itself in generating self-conscious creatures within itself. Nature, as an infinite force, limits itself within itself in order to produce new objects.

How do we know this? Schelling concludes that it must be through an intellectual intuition of nature's own creative powers. Although Förster credits Schelling both for seeing the deep problem within the Kantian system and for seeing how Fichte's own counter-proposal is too subjective, he objects that Schelling's recasting of Fichte's idea of intellectual intuition is not of any use. It looks more like a simple confusion about Fichte's fundamental insight "that 'I am' and 'it is' express two wholly distinct modes of being." (p. 249)

It is Goethe's recasting of the Kantian idea of an intuitive intellect that supplies the missing link in the story of how we move from Schelling to Hegel. On Goethe's view, amidst all of the variety of the empirical evidence, there is an "Idea" that nonetheless structures our grasp of the plant as a plant. We look at many plants, and this "Idea" begins to form in our minds such that we can now grasp the essence of a plant as a plant and can even construct possible although not real plants. If we understand the essence of the plant, we can also understand how, under the pressure of environment, adaptation and selection, it can metamorphize into the different kinds of real plants we empirically encounter. We get the essence from the intuitive understanding, but we get an understanding of the pressures of selection and the like from experiential observation and testing of empirical laws.

At this point, the last figure in the temporal sequence comes on the scene. Hegel, struggling to find his place in the world, arrives in Jena in 1801 and takes up the Schellingian banner. By around 1803, he has thrown the banner down, and in 1807, he publishes the Phenomenology and becomes "Hegel." What was the break with Schelling about (intellectually at least)? The break had first of all to do with Hegel's rejection of Schelling's use of "intellectual intuition" and with Hegel's replacement of it with his more logical, conceptual dialectic. Förster produces evidence (convincing to my mind) to show that Hegel changed his mind about a crucial aspect of his dialectic in the writing of the book. On Förster's reconstruction, Hegel had already adopted his more dialectical approach when he started the Phenomenology but had not yet arrived at the idea that there was a historical aspect to it. Still in his non-historicist phase, Hegel thought that he had completed his work, but then suddenly there was a dispute with the printer, the whole project almost came to a stop, and when it started up again, the book was now immensely longer than had been anticipated.

What happened? In a nutshell: Hegel was introduced by his friend, Schelver (a botanist) to Goethe's writings on the metamorphosis of plants at the same time that Hegel was lecturing on the history of philosophy. Hegel grasped quickly that something akin to Goethe's metamorphosis was the way in which philosophy, as a unitary discipline, went through historical transitions from one shape to another. He then extended that ideal of transition and development to Geist itself, and instead of the non-historical "science of the experience of consciousness" (which the Phenomenology started out to be), we ended up instead with a "phenomenology of spirit." Förster lays out compelling evidence that Hegel had completed his work at what is now the chapter titled "Reason," written a final, short chapter simply called "C: Science," sent it to the printer, had second thoughts on the matter, threw away the "C: Science" chapter and then added a long, historical chapter called "Spirit" to incorporate this new historical idea (and then inexorably went on to write the longer historical chapter on "Religion" only to end with the short, telegraphic chapter on "Absolute Knowledge"). This is a new account of what has always been a contentious part in the Hegelian system.

However, Förster is unconvinced that this really is the end of the story. Hegel's claim to "absolute knowledge" is shaky, he thinks, and in any event, what Hegel thought followed from it does not in fact follow from it. Thus, instead of what he sees as Hegel's "top down" approach (a "logic-as-metaphysics" followed by its application or realization in a philosophy of the real), there is the possibility of Goethe's "intuitive science," which takes individual "parts" (organisms, at least) in terms of their relation to the whole, and sees how the particular emerges from the synthetic universal. Förster concludes by noting that although we have by now tried Kantian, Reinholdian, Fichtean, Schellingian and Hegelian approaches, Goethe's approach is still as yet untested, even though Goethe left us with a proposal for what such a metaphysics might look like when applied to the shapes and examples of plants. (Although this seems on its surface to suggest a possible link between Goethe's idea, at least generally taken, and the more recent work by Michael Thompson and Sebastian Rödl on how species terms work, Förster does not explore that link. On the other hand, one can't do everything.)

This summary is almost embarrassingly inadequate to the kind of rich presentation that Förster has given us in his book. So much of his case lies in the details, and the details are what summaries necessarily exclude. But, as I said, specialists will be there ready to jump on lots of individual points Förster raises, so here is one minor quibble about one slightly neglected theme in Förster's book. Schelling takes up one of Fichte's terms to explicate his own Naturphilosophie, which is that of the series of "ideal" and "real" activities. For Fichte, that had to do with the way the "I" had to deal with the "Not-I," and how that led to further and further constructions (or "posits"). For Schelling, it had to do with how nature in its ideality is continually constructing itself by embodying its ideal structures in matter and producing ever more complex structures, all the way up to self-conscious creatures. Now, on Förster's interpretation, Hegel makes a substitution and, as Förster puts it, instead "focuses on the transitions between the determinations of thought (the categories)." (p. 294). The philosopher is a kind of observer of these transitions, and that boils down to this: "The observer makes explicit what is implicit in the observed consciousness." (p. 304). That language of "making explicit" sounds of course very Brandomian and may very well be right. But it's not obviously right. Another way of taking the transitions is to see them as having to do with realizations or actualizations of a principle where the realization is always contentious, and where different realizations are always contested. This is at least plausible with those obvious cases where we speak of rights, citizens, representation in government, caring for others, etc. In those cases, it is not at all clear that we are only making explicit proprieties already there in practice. Rather, we are choosing among competing realizations of those proprieties. Hegel likewise argues that such contestation is also present in very abstract theoretical matters (such as the use of the infinite in mathematics).

Now, if one is inclined to the "realization" view of this issue (rather than the "making explicit" view), then the discussion of how the ideal is to be realized and transformed by taking on various concrete embodiments would assume a slightly different shape from the one that Förster gives it. Fichte's conception of how the ideal is realized in practice in the confrontation with a recalcitrant natural reality and the unavoidable reality of other people forms one link, and Schelling's radical and rather Platonist naturalism that sees something like Plato's forms becoming dynamic as they embody themselves in matter is another link. Both are concerned with how the ideal is transformed in its more concrete realizations. Now, in their own times, Schelling was characterized as the modern Plato and Hegel as the German Aristotle. Is the last link thus the one that takes us to a reformed Aristotelian naturalism where both mind and world are bound up together within a more expansive conception of nature and where the constellation of problems thus has to do with how the realizations in history make a difference to the content of the ideals being realized? That can't be decided here since both God and the devil are in the details, and the details are exactly that for which reviews are not best suited. However, wherever the discussion goes, it is going to have to go on by taking Förster's big picture and all his detailed accounts into account.