The Two Selves: Their Metaphysical Commitments and Functional Independence

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Stanley B. Klein, The Two Selves: Their Metaphysical Commitments and Functional Independence, Oxford University Press, 2014, 153pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199349968.

Reviewed by John Barresi, Dalhousie University


At the center of William James's masterpiece, The Principles of Psychology (1890), are his chapters on the stream of consciousness and the self. He tackled these topics primarily from an experiential or phenomenological perspective, but connected them to the rising science of the brain. He didn't know how things would turn out in the end, but he insisted that the new science of psychology must never lose sight of the fact that understanding immediate experience must be at the center of its explanatory endeavors. In this work he struggled to avoid making metaphysical assumptions, particularly about how immediate experience might be grounded, not only in the material, but also in a spiritual realm. Yet, sometimes he couldn't help himself. As G. Stanley Hall points out in his review of the work for the American Journal of Psychology, when it came to metaphysics involving spirit, or pneumatology:

This outspoken writer becomes strangely timid, apologetic, self-conscious and self-contradictory here. He recurs over and over again to this in the form of "ultra cerebral conditions," "transcendental thinking agent," the "I that knows the me," "the same brain sub-serving many conscious selves," nowhere stalwartly asserting his pneumatology, but ostentatiously refusing to ring up the transparent metaphysical curtain behind which it is usually seen, and playing bo-peep with it with if, but and perhaps. (1891, 3, 588)

When one is trying to understand the "I that knows the me," while keeping close to immediate conscious experience, it may be endemic to get drawn into discussing metaphysics. It is certainly the case that while struggling to understand the origins of self-awareness as knower and as known in The Two Selves, Stanley Klein, even more than James, finds himself embroiled in metaphysical issues.

What Klein calls the "epistemological self" stands in for James's self as known, or the "me," while his "ontological self" stands in for James's self as knower, or the "I." However, there are differences between these two selves in James and Klein. For one, as Klein points out, James's knower and known are viewed as two aspects of one self constituted by the stream of personal consciousness, whereas Klein's two selves are defined in terms of different metaphysical commitments that Klein associates with the known self and the knowing self. Even before Klein portentously labels them the "epistemological self" and the "ontological self," in describing his aims Klein's two selves already carry their respective metaphysical commitments on their sleeves. He says that he will provide "philosophical and psychological evidence in support of the idea that the self of everyday experience consists of two aspects -- one material (the neuro-cognitive self) and one immaterial (the self of first-person subjectivity) " (p. xiii). Thus, rather than playing bo-peep with spiritual metaphysics like James, Klein, right from the start, raises the curtain on his pneumatology in order to give distinct ontological grounds to his two selves.

In introducing his use of the terms "epistemological" and "ontological" to describe the two selves, Klein says, "nothing substantive rides" on these particular terms. He views himself as following a long tradition in dividing the self into two essential aspects, and besides "the self as known and the self as knower" of James, other possible terms could have served just as well for the two selves, for instance, "self as object and self as subject," "self as experienced and self as experiencer," and "the self of science and the self of experience" (p. 9). In some ways it is this last distinction that provides the closest fit for an alternative terminology for Klein, because it contrasts the self that we can know through materialistic science, and the "first-person subjectivity" that we experience directly and that Klein believes to be immaterial.

When he defines the epistemological self, he focuses on those aspects of self-knowledge acquired through self-reflection that can become objects of investigation in cognitive neuroscience. By contrast, he holds that the first-person subjectivity that we enjoy and which he labels the "ontological self" cannot be reflected on, but only sensed or felt in a non-conceptual way that makes it nearly impossible to approach through science, and certainly not by using the methods of reductive materialistic science. The ontological self's apparent unity, simplicity and continuity without content, distinguishes it from the epistemological self, which has various types of content and as such can be studied as an object. The ontological self, though reflexively self-aware, cannot become an object of knowledge in an objective sense. What we can learn about it must come through a wider sense of empirical study, one not restricted to the study of objects capable of traditional materialistic science, which can accept its possible status as an immaterial aspect of reality of which we have direct experience.

I shall say no more about the philosophical arguments used by Klein to support these controversial metaphysical claims. What is likely to be of greater interest to the general reader are the empirical studies that ground Klein's distinction between the two selves, since they are quite illuminating for any general theory of self, regardless of one's metaphysics. It seems to me that the strength of Klein's work is in his detailed articulation of this research, much of which was done by him with patients who had various neuropsychological disorders.

The epistemological self is described as the neurocognitive system that provides the ontological self with its self-referential content. Based on studies both of normal individuals and individuals with various neurological and psychological disorders, Klein finds evidence for a number of knowledge systems related to self. "These include but are not limited to:" "Episodic memories of one's life events," "Semantic summaries of one's personality traits," "Semantic knowledge of facts about one's life," "An experience of continuity through time," "The physical self," and "The emotional self " (pp. 21-22).

Several of these systems have been the focus of Klein's own research and have been shown to be functionally independent of each other as evidenced by their dissociation across case studies. For instance, a person might have lost her ability to remember any specific events in her life, so she has no recollective or "episodic" memory as such. Nevertheless, she can readily ascribe traits to herelf and do so accurately, at least with respect to a comparison with attribution of these traits to her by close relatives. Moreover, this ability can continually update its content, even while the total loss of episodic memory continues in current experience and one's personality has changed. In some cases, an individual with episodic memory loss can still remember facts about herself, such as the university that she went to. These facts are not represented as particular episodes, but as general facts, similar to other facts that she may know about events that occurred in the world at large or in history. Some individuals who can no longer retain knowledge of recent events involving themselves, yet can still remember facts and events involving themselves from their own pasts, may also have lost their ability to update and describe their current personality traits, having only knowledge of their traits from the past. Cases involving late phases of dementia fit this last pattern.

In contrast with the epistemological self, there is little concrete that one can say about the ontological self. This first person experience of yourself carries no content that can be shared with others. It is not about your body, or your memories, or even your emotions. It is only about experiencing these things as content, and the feeling that this experiencing "I" is a single thing, or process, apparently of a simple, unified, and enduring nature, an unchanging subjectivity that receives content from the epistemological self, but is not itself a form of content.

This is, at least, the picture that Klein presents of the ontological self. Thus, his long chapter on this self is more about what it is not, than what it is. Yet, when he summarizes the two selves in a subsequent chapter he writes that the ontological self is "the conscious self, experienced as first-person subjectivity" and that it is "Occurrent -- that is, it is an ever-present (save, perhaps, for episodes of dreamless sleep or vegetative coma) form of experience," "A phenomenological unity," "Invariant (which follows from its having no parts or properties to undergo change," and that "Lacking properties, it cannot be directly known. Rather it is given as experience and can be sensed only by virtue of its felt presence" (pp. 76-77).

With respect to the possible relationship between the ontological self and neural sources, Klein points to living individuals, who have little or no cortex, but have subcortical neural systems that may be involved in having experiences, though without the content of self as that is represented in the epistemological systems of the cortex. Such individuals have no language, so cannot express their experiences, if they have any. Even so, they show signs of learning and other dispositions that we associate with consciousness. Since we cannot get reports from such individuals we cannot determine if they are self-aware, and on Klein's view, simply being aware, without self-awareness, would not count as enjoying first-person subjectivity. So, even if sentience without self-awareness were involved in cases of this sort, these individuals would not have first-person subjectivity in Klein's sense of this term.

A long chapter on the relationship between the two selves provides the crux of the book. It is where Klein presents evidence for the functional independence of the two selves and of the form of their integration in normal experience, which he takes as providing empirical support for his conceptual distinction between them. He argues that "personal ownership" is the "mental glue" that connects the ontological self to the epistemological self. When this glue breaks down, the ontological self refuses to accept as owned self-referential mental states presented to it by the epistemological self. In pathologies of this sort the content is available to awareness, but is not accepted as personally owned: "Despite maintaining a clear sense of hosting a mental state (i.e., perspectival ownership), the occurrent state no longer is experienced as belonging to the ontological self. Its sense of being given to consciousness as 'mine' (i.e., its personal ownership) no longer is present" (p. 89).

Klein describes a variety of cases in which personal ownership is distorted, including thought insertion in schizophrenia, the denial of body parts that one does not feel but can see in anosognosia, and the feeling that one does not exist in depersonalization. He argues that these cases are not sufficiently pure for theoretical purposes, due to comorbidity and possible delusions. He hangs his argument on two "pure" cases. In one, a person is aware of perceptual states from his current observational perspective ("in his head"), but doesn't feel that they are his own perceptual states and must take a second step to infer that they must be his.

The second case deals with episodic memory, and Klein personally reported separately on it. It involves an individual who, as a result of an accident, had a temporary loss of episodic memories. However, as these memories began to return, he would remember the events as if in the first-person, but they seemed more imagined than owned, as if constructed from a third-person source. The remembered event did not feel as if it was part of his life, though intellectually, he knew it was. But gradually some of these memories would shift state from just being known, to being owned as part of his life. The feeling of ownership was added to the memory, thus, in Klein's theoretical interpretation, a reintegration of the two independent selves with respect to that memory occurred. But, as Klein admits in the end, the functional independence of perspectival awareness and ownership of this kind could be interpreted as involving independent systems of one self rather than requiring two separate selves. So, if one does not accept his conceptual arguments for the two selves, these results on personal ownership, however interesting as a pathology of selfhood, will not require one to accept his theory that there are two metaphysically distinct selves that interact in normal experience.

It is surprising, at least to me, that Klein's coverage of a variety of cases of distortion of ownership doesn't consider two types of cases that seem most likely to challenge his notion that, while there are multiple partially independent systems that compose the epistemological self, the ontological self is a simple unity that cannot have parts. These two types are instances of split-brains and dissociative identity, or multiple personality. It may be that on Klein's criteria, these would not represent "pure" cases. Nevertheless, prima facie, these two types seem to challenge his notion that ontological self is a simple and unified first-person subjectivity. Moreover, they challenge the notion that multiplicity of relations involving ownership are due entirely to a single first-person subjectivity owning or not owning offerings of the epistemological self, which can divide into separable systems involving traits, episodic memories, and life events. Instead, at least in cases of dissociative identity, we find multiple personal consciousnesses, as James defined them, each with a first-person subjectivity that takes ownership of its own self-referential content of various types, while denying ownership of self-relevant content associated with other personal consciousnesses.[1] Cases such as these suggest that there is no ontological self to oppose to an epistemological self. Instead, there are various self-systems supported by brain activity that are usually integrated in normal experience but under unusual circumstances can partition in a variety of ways that are sometimes incongruent with Klein's ontology.

The Two Selves is a fascinating volume, showing the struggles of a modern brain scientist trying to be true to the phenomena of self, while not losing sight of what we have learned from the many disciplines that have contributed to our understanding of self over the 125 years since James wrote his book. Yet, I wish that Klein had shown more modesty with respect to metaphysical explorations and stuck closer to the phenomena of self-experience and to what we already know or can speculate about it using the best science and philosophy that we have at the present time. We can leave the 'hard problem' of consciousness involved in self-awareness to solve at a later date. Cognitive scientists, like Klein and me, would do better to follow James and try to inhibit metaphysical speculations that go beyond immediate experience. Leave it to those who specialize in metaphysics to work out the nature of reality taken in its widest sense. We have enough to do just giving these specialists material with which to widen their horizons. We can only hope that in the long run our collective endeavors will prove fruitful and we will eventually come to a deep understanding of what it is to be a person and self.


[1] See John Barresi, "Time and the dialogical self," in H. Hermans and T. Gieser, eds., Handbook of Dialogical Self Theory, (pp. 46-63), New York: Cambridge University Press, 2012, for a clear example of this sort of case.-