The Tyranny of Science

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Paul Feyerabend, The Tyranny of Science, Polity Press, 2011, 153pp., $59.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780745651903.

Reviewed by John Preston, The University of Reading


In the early 1990s, Paul Feyerabend worked up an entire course of lectures he had previously and repeatedly given at the University of California, Berkeley into a smaller series of lectures entitled 'What is knowledge? What is science?'. These were originally delivered to a general audience, but four of them have now been edited by Feyerabend-expert Eric Oberheim, and published in the form of this book. Gratitude is owed to Oberheim for doing so, since the book constitutes an important expression of Feyerabend's last views on science (he died in 1994), one which stands well alongside the volume Conquest of Abundance (University of Chicago Press, 2000), which featured among its contents the unfinished manuscript of Feyerabend's final projected work. After each of the four lectures, Oberheim has included a few pages of transcript from the discussion that followed their delivery.

The main themes of The Tyranny of Science seem to me to be as follows. Scientists and philosophers sometimes present science as a unified worldview, a monolith (or a monster, depending on one's preferences). It is not. Science is both incomplete and quite strongly disunified. It does not speak with a single voice, therefore appeals to the abstraction 'Science' are out of place. The associated ideology sometimes known as objectivism, or scientific materialism, which takes science to be our ultimate measure of what exists, is therefore ungrounded. Its defenders, who portray themselves as the defenders of Reason, are often the kind of intellectual imperialists whose attitudes and advice in the past led, or would have led, to the destruction of first-nation communities, or similar political atrocities.

Other equally popular philosophical claims about science are also flawed. The widespread idea that science is successful needs interrogation. Science does have some successes to its credit, but these can be detached from the ideology that seems to support them. When it comes to methodology, the empiricist idea that science starts from facts, and eschews theories until the facts are gathered, is a myth. The same can be said of the idea that science is value-free, but also of the idea that scientific results are relevant to urgent social problems.

One aspect of the disunity of science is that the expression 'scientists' should not mean merely theoreticians: science also (and essentially) features experimentalists. In their work the importance of hands-on experience, and of what Michael Polanyi called 'tacit knowledge', is most obvious. But in fact these sorts of experience and knowledge play an important role throughout the sciences, even in their most obviously theoretical parts. The Platonic-rationalist picture of science as a kind of pure thinking about the nature of reality is a distortion.

Perhaps the book's central complaint is that a particular abstract, theoretical, 'objectivist' kind of science, together with an associated kind of thinking about science, now dominate our thinking, excluding more human modes of thought. Scientism, the belief that science has the answer to all meaningful questions is also a target (although Feyerabend doesn't explicitly identify it as such).

Feyerabend treats these issues in various ways. One of his typical strategies, though, is to take some hallowed idea (e.g., that the success of science is due to observation and experiment), and ask: how did it arise? Tracing its ancestry back to ancient Greek thinkers (usually Plato, Parmenides, or Xenophanes), he assesses their arguments for it and finds them optional, as it were, and thus eminently resistible. His complaint is not that their arguments are invalid, though -- perhaps that would already be to take on a quasi-scientific mode of assessment. Instead, Feyerabend makes it clear that he prefers 'stories' (or even 'fairytales') to arguments, and that rival stories are to be assessed in terms of how interesting, appealing, or revealing they are. The sorts of stories the ancient Greek tragedians told, being more obviously human, fare better on such measures than those of the ancient Greek philosophers, so we should not assume that philosophers are our best guides in such matters.

How compelling is this historical strategy? We might note that it could well turn into a double-edged sword. If we could find disreputable ancestors for ideas, or find that our preferred ideas only have their current status because they triumphed at some past time in a way that now seems problematic, almost any idea might be undermined. Sometimes I suspect that this is what Feyerabend wants, that his commitment to pluralism amounts to a thoroughgoing scepticism about the notion that any one idea (theory, framework, etc.) is really better than any other, epistemically-speaking. That would leave only non-epistemic modes of assessment, such as the assessment of how conducive to happiness views are. At other times I get the impression that Feyerabend thinks that if we could somehow make the competition between ideas fair, then we could say that one such view is epistemically-preferable to another. It's not clear whether the historical strategy is being used to show merely that certain views are undeservedly popular, or whether it's being used to show that no view could ever really deserve (epistemic) credit.

Perhaps the other obvious thing to note is that Feyerabend's opponents will hardly be impressed by the historical strategy. They would undoubtedly protest that even if it could be shown that their view or approach triumphed in the far-distant past in a way we might now regard as problematic, showing this does not suffice to undermine it. If we can show, for example, that one view is now epistemically more virtuous than another, that might still be taken as a good reason to prefer it. Feyerabend's procedure, his insistence on treating the views of his opponents in terms of their ancestry, contains a strong suspicion of what such opponents would undoubtedly think of as a genetic fallacy. It also depends quite heavily on his alleged personal preference for stories over arguments. If his opponent cleaves to arguments, it's hard to see how Feyerabend can do any more than reassert his own preference. After all, he can hardly argue that there's no such thing as a decent argument, or even that stories are somehow objectively preferable. The metaphilosophical procedure suggested by his remarks seems fraught with deep difficulties in this respect.

I think we ought also to note that the disunity of science on which Feyerabend (rightly, in my view) insists, actually makes critiquing the role of science in society more difficult. If advocates of scientism cannot appeal to 'Science' (a supposed single institution) in defence of their views, neither can their opponents (such as Feyerabend) make a parallel case against 'Science' and its effects -- all such arguments have to be conducted on a case-by-case basis. Indeed, the idea that there could be such a thing as 'the tyranny of science' seems dissipated by the disunity thesis itself.

Eric Oberheim has done an excellent job in editing this material for publication, and also contributes a useful editor's introduction to the book. The Tyranny of Science is an important addition to Feyerabend's published oeuvre. My one quibble is with the title chosen for the volume. Here I think a simple translation of the original Italian title of the lectures, Ambiguity and Harmony, would have been more appropriate, since Feyerabend clearly insists on the ambiguity of concepts, and on the clash between ideas (rather than their harmony). The book is about a tyranny of science only in the sense that Feyerabend thinks that a certain sort of science should not be allowed to dominate, and that a certain sort of acquiescence to the pronouncements of scientists should not be indulged in. Would it be cynical of me to speculate that it may have been the publishers who were more keen on the somewhat more provocative title under which the book has appeared?