The Ultimate Why Question: Why Is There Anything at All Rather than Nothing Whatsoever?

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John F. Wippel (ed.), The Ultimate Why Question: Why Is There Anything at All Rather than Nothing Whatsoever? The Catholic University of America Press, 2011, 255pp., $59.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780813218632.

Reviewed by Ingo Farin, University of Tasmania


Philosophy departments tend to promote philosophy with reference to the "big questions" in life which are not addressed by the specialized disciplines in today's universities. The ultimate why question undoubtedly is one of the "big questions," and John F. Wippel deserves credit for having put together an engaging selection of essays by contemporary philosophers who discuss answers to this question, mostly by recourse to the rich philosophical tradition.

In his introductory remarks, Wippel is quick to concede that the legitimacy and indeed meaningfulness of the ultimate why question is "controversial" itself (p. 1). This insight, however, is only partially and incompletely reflected in the volume. There are two reasons for this. First, the bulk of the essays consist of strictly historical studies that trace out various treatments of the ultimate why question in ancient, medieval, modern, and contemporary philosophy. This historical or antiquarian focus does not lend itself to a free and systematic investigating of the cogency and meaningfulness of the question itself. Secondly, for the most part Wippel selected essays designed to present positive "solutions" and "answers," often in a decidedly theocentric fashion, which again de-emphasizes the need to probe the legitimacy of the question in the first place. It should also be noted that some contributions address the ultimate why question only in a rather indirect and oblique way, focusing instead on theories about such things as divine creation, God's omnipotence, or the proofs of the existence of God.

In an opening essay, Lloyd P. Gerson argues that "the Platonic tradition can fairly claim to be the fons et origo of reflection on the question 'why is there something rather than nothing'" (p. 29). As Gerson argues, to get the question off the ground is a challenge in itself. For the radical nature of this question must not be confused with the Aristotelian concept of change or "relative non-being," i.e., why some specific property appears here and now, which is explained by recourse to something else that exists and causes the change (p. 30). On the other side of the issue, Gerson refers to Parmenides, who had argued that "something" could not come out of or be dissolved into "nothing," for such an argument requires that we can identify the "something" in question as "being something identifiable," thus being at some point in "the realm of nothingness," which is of course unintelligible or contradictory (p. 29).

According to Gerson, Plato's Idea of the Good is an attempt to find an alternative this side of Aristotle and Parmenides. The Idea of the Good functions as an absolute principle which accounts for and explains all beings. It "provides being (einai) and ousia to that which is knowable," while it is "beyond ousia" itself (p. 31). Ousia implies limitedness and, therefore, cannot function as the absolute first principle of all. Next, Gerson argues that it is Plotinus who applies Plato's concept of erōs to the Idea of the Good, or the One, which allows him to attribute "self-love" to it as well (p. 33). Gerson takes this "self-love" as a gloss for the idea that the first principle is, as Plotinus puts it, "self-caused [aition heautou]" (p. 34). According to Plotinus, the One makes "itself from nothing (oudenos)" (p. 33), and all other things "derive their existence from it" (p. 35). For Plotinus holds that the self-love of the One is "essentially self-diffusive," that is to say, the "work" of its love is the production of everything else (p. 34). And Gerson concludes that, given Plotinus' metaphysical framework, "the self-diffusion of the Good is the only possible answer to the question: 'why is there something rather than nothing?'" (p. 36).

The two essays devoted to Medieval Philosophy bear out Gerson's claim of the dominating and lasting influence of the Platonic and neo-Platonic tradition. But there are also important new accents which cast doubt on any self-same identity of the ultimate why question. For instance, in his essay on Aquinas, Wippel concedes that he has "not found Aquinas raising this [ultimate why] question [why there is anything at all rather than nothing whatsoever] in these exact words" (p. 84). According to Wippel, Aquinas raises a very similar question, which Wippel paraphrases as follows: "Why [has] God created anything at all rather than nothing whatsoever" (p. 89). Aquinas' answer follows Plotinus: The self-effusion of the Good or God is the ultimate reason for the act of creation.

Jon McGinnis starts his discussion on Avicenna with the admission that "The question 'Why is there anything at all rather than absolutely nothing?' was not a question medieval Arabic-speaking philosophers were prone to raise" (p. 65). Instead, their focus was on the more specific question: "Why does the world have the particular features that it has?" That is to say, starting from some given "physical fact" or specific property in the world they reasoned backwards to God as a necessary cause (p. 65). According to McGinnis, Avicenna's originality lies in his attempt at a metaphysical proof for the existence of God that is based on the "modal" analysis of being qua being, according to which the structure of existence as such requires that if anything whatsoever exists, God necessarily exists (p. 66). In contrast to a cosmological argument, Avicenna makes no specific reference to a given, physical being. Regarding the original question why there is anything at all, McGinnis states that Avicenna's answer would be "because something is possible" (p. 83). But one wonders how satisfying an answer that is.

May Sim's informative essay addresses "The Question of Being, Non-Being, and 'Creation ex Nihilo' in Chinese Philosophy." After giving a brief exposition of the argument that Chinese philosophy never asked "The Question of Being," because Chinese language does not lend itself to "any dialectic between being and non-being," (pp. 43-44), Sim turns to Robert Neville's opposite view, according to which there are "structural" parallels to creation ex nihilo in Chinese philosophy, "despite the absence" of any direct such language (p. 44). Sim's detailed discussion shows that while a discourse about being and non-being can be found in Chinese philosophy, it falls short of Neville's strong thesis of a parallelism between Chinese and Western thought concerning the specific idea of creation ex nihilo. Although Sim agrees that Chinese philosophy addresses something like an ontological ground or a "creative nothing" that accounts for the contingent world, she argues that Neville's specific understanding of it as an indeterminate and wholly unknowable source is contradicted in Chinese philosophy, because it makes substantive pronouncements about the ultimate source, thus marking it as not entirely indeterminate.

Tad M. Schmaltz discusses a familiar double dilemma in Descartes. On the one hand, Descartes argues that if God lacks an efficient cause, there must be at least a reason for his existence. On the other hand, Descartes also holds that God is the free creator of all eternal truths, all of which are made true by God without independent, antecedent reasons. But if created truths include the true statement "God exists," there is, contrary to Descartes' stipulation, an efficient cause for God's existence, because this truth is willed by God. Moreover, since God's eternal truths are not determined by reasons, it also follows that there is no ultimate reason for God's existence, which again is contrary to Descartes' earlier stipulation. Drawing on Harry Frankfurt's and Jonathan Bennett's as well as Desgabet's and Regis' attempts at disarming this dilemma, Schmaltz suggests that the solution might simply be to restrict the scope of God's eternal truths to created beings.

Daniel O. Dahlstrom gives a superb review of Leibniz' principle of sufficient reason by way of a highly critical and illuminating discussion of the Leibniz interpretation put forward by Heidegger in his book Der Satz vom Grund. Although Dahlstrom agrees with Heidegger that Leibniz's principle is not merely logical or epistemological, but also metaphysical and ontological, Dahlstrom takes issue with three distinct features in Heidegger's interpretation. First, Dahlstrom emphasizes that, despite some vacillation, Leibniz tends to embrace the non-necessitarian view according to which the sufficient reason for the contingency of the world is "God's own free choice to actualize this world" (p. 132). According to Dahlstrom, Heidegger tends to overlook "this contingency and its compatibility with the universal existential scope of the principle of sufficient reason" (p. 134). Second, although Dahlstrom accepts Heidegger's main interpretive line -- that for Leibniz the principle of sufficient reason is something retrieved by, and given and conveyed to the finite subject, making it the master over everything that is -- he holds that Heidegger overplays that card. Dahlstrom notes that Heidegger conveniently forgets that "the sufficient reason was never absent from God such that it must or should be given back to Him" (p. 137). In other words, Heidegger over-accentuates what he takes to be Leibniz's "grounding" of the principle of sufficient reason in finite subjectivity. Third, Dahlstrom argues that Heidegger does not recognize the extent to which Leibniz develops an understanding of being, which is distinct from beings and an ungrounded ground for that which shows itself. After all, Leibniz holds that "God's being is not grounded in something else," and God's knowledge about the creation makes room for contingent truths and an open future (p. 143). Dahlstrom finds here an unrecognized correspondence to Heidegger's own doctrine of the withdrawal of being which allows "the interplay of presences and absences in which beings are able to appear" (p. 140).

Holger Zaborowski investigates Schelling's life-long attention to the ultimate why question. Zaborowski argues that the idea of freedom is paramount in Schelling's thought. The early Schelling postulates an absolute free Ego as the source of everything: the "unconditioned and the condition of all that is conditioned -- freedom itself" (p. 156). In his later works, Schelling moves to a theocentric position. As Zaborowski puts it, Schelling realized "that without taking God as the starting-point one could not possibly answer the ultimate why question" (p. 162). Despite this new position, Schelling still draws on the original theme of freedom. According to Schelling, "God was free to be or not to be," and he was "free to start a theogonic process or not" (p. 164). Freedom is still the source of everything. Zaborowski summarizes this as follows: "God, Schelling thinks, must be thought to be free to be or not to be, for he, as free causa sui, is the Lord, the subject, as it were, of Being, not the object of the necessity of Being" (p. 167).

In his rich essay on Hegel, Edward C. Halper notes a fundamental problem in the traditional "answers" to the ultimate why question. The putative power of the stipulated first, transcendent cause to explain everything comes at the price of specificity: "Because the first cause is responsible for everything's being what it is, it explains nothing in particular" (p. 176). Secondly, since the ultimate cause must be unlike anything it causes, it follows that "we cannot know it" (p. 176). Yet "it is a contradiction to say that there is a cause that accounts for something but we do not know this cause; for if we know that the cause is at work as a cause, then we do know the cause" (p. 177).

According to Halper, one can read Hegel's Logic as an attempt to bypass these difficulties by stipulating not a transcendent, determinate cause of everything, but rather an indeterminate cause which determines itself, such that through its self-determination it becomes the comprehensive principle of everything. In the beginning, Being lacks all determination, but this Nothing characterizes it minimally (and affords intelligibility), and it sets the stage for Becoming, out of which all the other concepts can be developed. Consequently, Hegel's ultimate cause achieves itself at the end of the development in the comprehensive totality of everything. As Halper puts it, "It is Being's self-determination that begins the process that culminates at the end of the system with a richly differentiated Being that is its own unfolding" (p. 184). While Hegel's comprehensive and knowable ultimate cause thus circumvents the problems of the traditional accounts, it has its own difficulty, because "in accounting for all things through each other," Hegel's cause "fails to explain why the well-structured whole should exist" altogether (p. 185). In the end, neither the transcendent and unknowable cause nor the knowable and comprehensive cause can satisfy our curiosity, as Halper himself notes. But that is no reason to give up thinking through what lies at the root of the ultimate why question, i.e., "the fundamental mystery of the world," or "the world's not being self-sufficient" (p. 188).

Robert Cummings Neville's essay on "Some Contemporary Theories of Divine Creation" is the only essay in the volume that is purely theological in nature. Making no concessions to the philosophically minded, Cummings first puts forward a critique of process theology, in order to then defend an alternative ex nihilo ground-of-being-theology. The details of that discussion go beyond philosophy and require a proper theological focus instead.

In his essay, "Pragmatic Reflections on Final Causality," Brian Martine suggests that the ultimate why question "is simply meaningless" (p. 206). The reason is that the purported disjunction between something and "nothing whatsoever" collapses because we do not have a handle on what it could possibly mean to posit (even in thought) "nothing whatsoever." The supposition of "nothing," devoid of any relation to anything whatsoever, fails to provide any grip for thought, rendering the enterprise not futile, but unintelligible. According to Martine, the only intelligible version of the ultimate why question is the far more modest one: "Why is there this something rather than some other something?" (p. 208) Martine takes Plato's recourse to the Ideas as an attempt to address this question. For instance, Socrates finds himself in prison because "his being there is required by justice itself" (p. 209). That one state of affairs obtains rather than some other is thus explained with regard to purposeful practice in which human beings engage. Of course, Martine does not rule out materialist explanations. But he notes that theory is purposeful "practice" in itself (p. 216). Martine's critical proposal to recast the ultimate why question in terms of specific why questions makes room for and endorses modern scientific as well as moral and political why questions, while it lets go of the uncritical fascination with an ultimate why question that has haunted the tradition.

The last contribution in the volume is by Nicholas Rescher. He proposes an amazingly simple answer to the question why there is anything at all. "It is for the best" that the world is, and it is "for the best" that the world has the features that it has (p. 221). Rescher bases this on what he calls the "axiogenetic optimality principle," according to which "in the virtual competition for existence among alternatives it is the comparatively best that is bound to prevail" (p. 218). He also calls it the "Law of Optimality," holding that it is a kind of "modus operandi" of reality resulting in "a tropism toward a certain end or telos, namely optimalization" (pp. 218-219). According to Rescher, the optimality principle is not generative. It merely eliminates sub-optimal outcomes in favor of the best possible outcome: "Whatever possibility is for the best is ipso facto the possibility that is actualized" (p. 220). Rescher suggests that this law functions as an entirely "impersonal" feature of existence, making it in principle independent of any transcendent law giver or God (p. 224). Rescher is also quick to point out that the optimality principle is not anthropocentrically inclined or biased towards any particular target group or groups. Rather, what is "best" is best "to the condition of existence-as-a-whole" (p. 228). In other words, "very real imperfections from the angle of narrowly parochial concerns of interest" may very well be part of an altogether optimal outcome (p. 299).

But does the optimality principle obtain? Rescher gives no evidence for it, although he does suggest that, "in the final analysis," the actual reality of the optimality principle is something required by the principle itself (p. 220). The principle supports itself, as it were, as it would be for the best if it was in effect. In any case, it is clear that no empirical evidence for or against it could ever be given. Not only that, the optimality principle is entirely vacuous, as it explains nothing in particular. It just adds to whatever exists "and it is for the best." But if everything automatically and naturally is "for the best," nothing is.