The Undiscovered Dewey: Religion, Morality, and the Ethos of Democracy

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Melvin L. Rogers, The Undiscovered Dewey: Religion, Morality, and the Ethos of Democracy, Columbia UP, 2009, 328 pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231144865.

Reviewed by Paul Fairfield, Queen's University (Canada)



This book promises a great deal. As the title indicates, it is nothing short of a previously “undiscovered Dewey” — undiscovered, that is, by the existing scholarship — that Melvin Rogers wishes to present, a claim that he realizes “may seem a bit cavalier” to some readers (ix). It indeed seems that way to this reader, given the number of important studies of Dewey that have appeared in recent years, many of which Rogers mentions and from which he wishes to distinguish his account. Dewey scholarship has come rather a long way in the last couple of decades, as Rogers well realizes, yet his preface announces, “This book offers a new perspective on the foundations of John Dewey’s philosophy and so tilts our understanding of his religious, ethical, and political reflections in a novel direction” (ix). One might question just how new that perspective is. For my part, I did not come away from this text with a very different understanding of Dewey than before. Notwithstanding, Rogers has given us a very competent and often subtle reading of Dewey that well deserves the attention of Dewey scholars.

What is the undiscovered Dewey? It is, Rogers argues, a reading of Dewey that makes his indebtedness to Darwinian biology more explicit than hitherto and identifies some implications of that influence. While it has long been known that Dewey was influenced profoundly by Darwin — Dewey himself hardly made a secret of this — Rogers’ contention is that contemporary scholars for the most part

miss or diminish in various ways the profound influence of Charles Darwin’s account of evolution on Dewey’s notion of inquiry and the corresponding ideas of contingency and uncertainty it introduced. By focusing on this influence, I show that for him, our cognitive abilities are both stimulated and potentially frustrated by contingency, and that this beginning point guides even as it humbles the significance of human action (ix).

An appreciation of contingency, uncertainty, and intellectual humility was deeply embedded in Dewey’s pragmatic experimentalism, even if this has not been understood, or not adequately, by many of Dewey’s readers and critics. Rogers therefore sets out to describe the intellectual context in which Dewey’s appropriation of Darwinian thought occurred, especially as this pertains to religion, ethics, and politics. Rather than accent the themes of evolution and progress that this might imply, Rogers describes a theory of inquiry that instead “proceeds from and must not presume to overcome the uncertainty that characterizes human action” (xi). It is a decidedly un-Promethean Dewey that Rogers proffers or, at any rate, one whose conception of inquiry balances an optimism about the power of rational reflection to intervene in human affairs with a sense of the uncertainty of all plans. Among the more important themes Dewey would appropriate from Darwin is an appreciation of contingency, which he would carry over into his epistemology and his philosophy more generally.

At the foundation, then, of this decidedly non-foundationalist thinker is a heightened sense of contingency and uncertainty, the primary source of which is Darwinian biology. Rogers spends the first part of this two-part book elaborating on this theme. “From Certainty to Contingency” is the title of Part One, while the two chapters that it contains are titled “Protestant Self-Assertion and Spiritual Sickness” and “Agency and Inquiry After Darwin”. Rogers spends a good deal of time here responding to Dewey’s critics as well as more friendly interpreters. He is especially concerned to refute interpretations of Dewey’s ontology according to which this ontology is essentially in keeping with Enlightenment and Newtonian conceptions of a rationally ordered universe. His criticisms are undoubtedly well taken, as is his attempt in Chapter 2 to spell out “Dewey’s Modified Aristotelianism”, especially as this bears on Aristotle’s conception of practical reason. While Dewey made few explicit references to the notion of phronesis in his writings, Rogers maintains that Dewey adapted this concept to an essentially Darwinian framework. Beyond this, Rogers correctly argues that Dewey’s philosophy, including his moral and political thought, builds on a set of ontological commitments, yet a very different set of commitments than what typified Enlightenment thought and which again draws heavily upon Darwin. As he writes,

Darwin centralized contingency, as opposed to order, harmony, and regularity, as the essence of existence, and Dewey exploited its significance to outline a vision of human enlightenment that at once encouraged self-assertion and cautioned epistemic and practical humility (6).

Part Two, titled “Religion, the Moral Life, and Democracy”, contains three chapters: “Faith and Democratic Piety”, “Within the Space of Moral Reflection”, and “Constraining Elites and Managing Power”. A surprising amount of attention is paid throughout this book to religion — not only Dewey’s but the context of liberal Protestantism to which he was responding. Those who are interested in certain religious currents of the later nineteenth and early twentieth centuries in the United States and how they informed Dewey’s religious naturalism, especially as expressed in A Common Faith (1934), will find a thorough discussion of this here. Rogers’ analysis of Dewey’s ethics takes as its point of departure the problem posed at the turn of the last century by the decline of morality’s religious foundation. How, the question became, can we produce an overhauled moral philosophy that incorporates a Darwinian sensibility while being more attuned to moral conflict than modern conceptions of ethics tend to be? If the problematic situation to which Dewey was responding was the crisis of normative evaluation posed by the giving way of morality’s religious foundations, the solution lay in “a vision of the moral life that is grounded more firmly in a kind of mutual responsiveness that, in Dewey’s view, must be made explicit in future evaluative moments” (189). A similar analysis applies to Dewey’s politics, where again a conception of experimental inquiry indebted to Darwin is brought to bear on the problem of power under democratic conditions. An important question here is whether Dewey’s theory of democracy gives rise, as certain of his critics allege, to a vanguard politics, one in which a body of elites plan more and more aspects of social reality in light of some idealized set of solutions to problems. Rogers correctly answers this question in the negative. “Dewey’s account of democracy,” he writes,

flows from the belief that it provides the widest arena for applying inquiry to the problems of collective organization… . [I]t stands to reason that those most affected ought to serve as the beginning and terminal points for developing and testing solutions (194-5).

A democratic citizenry is genuinely authoritative, on Dewey’s conception, and does not merely grant or withhold assent to what experts decree. For Dewey, collective deliberation and problem solving among experts, politicians, and citizens alike is an attainable ideal, while democracy itself is a way of life that is forever unsettled and in process of realizing provisional values and contingent solutions to problems.

It has been more than half a century since Dewey’s death, yet it remains necessary for scholars to overcome the many confusions and misinterpretations that greeted his work from the beginning and that remain unfortunately widespread. Rogers’ study continues the effort to recover what Dewey actually said from the caricatures and to allow his texts to speak to contemporary problems to which they have obvious relevance. The one criticism I would express is that this study makes very little reference to Hegel and does not incorporate the insights that James Good’s A Search for Unity in Diversity: The ‘Permanent Hegelian Deposit’ in the Philosophy of John Dewey (Lanham: Lexington, 2006) has brought to our attention. Dewey’s Darwinian and Hegelian influences are closely connected and of about equal importance. Good’s text is not among the many scholarly treatments of Dewey that Rogers discusses and is not included in the bibliography, nor is Hegel a significant topic of discussion in this book. This is unfortunate since Rogers’ project of reinterpreting the philosophical underpinnings of Dewey’s thought might have greatly benefited from a more sustained integration of Hegelian themes. Nonetheless, The Undiscovered Dewey is a fine study that Dewey scholars will certainly wish to read.