The Undivided Self: Aristotle and the ‘Mind-Body’ Problem

The Undivided Self Aristotle And The Mind Body Problem

David Charles, The Undivided Self: Aristotle and the ‘Mind-Body’ Problem, Oxford University Press, 2021, 303pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198869566.

Reviewed by Bryan C. Reece, University of Arkansas


The contents of this important and impressive study of Aristotle’s hylomorphic psychology are enmattered, whether inextricably or not, in a preface, introduction, eight chapters, bibliography, and indices of passages, names, and topics. David Charles’s exposition and analysis are characteristically rigorous. Readers should expect to be thoroughly exercised and to be rewarded for their labors with textual and theoretical insights at every turn by one of the greatest systematizers of Aristotle’s philosophy of the past four decades. The book is detailed and technical, replete with subtle distinctions and enumerations of commitments, but Charles thoroughly explains his most important and controversial points, repeats them with sufficient frequency, and provides helpful examples to aid readers who are interested in exploring some of Aristotle’s most difficult discussions.

The main thesis, which never recedes far from the foreground of the discussion, is that Aristotle’s psychological theory avoids a familiar sort of “mind-body problem.” More precisely, his theory leaves no room for the unbridgeable explanatory gap that opens when “post-Cartesians” attempt to say what connection something purely psychological (viz., “defined without any explicit reference in its definition to the physical”) could have with something purely physical (viz., “defined without any explicit reference in its definition to the psychological”). For example, why is a purely psychological desire for revenge reliably associated with a purely physical boiling of the blood, or the phenomenal experience of seeing red with occurrences in the visual organs? Post-Cartesian attempts all make their mistake in supposing that the relevant objects of psychological study are pure in either of these ways. If there are these two components, a purely psychological and a purely physical one, for each of the relevant phenomena (emotion, desire, perception, etc.), then we face the insurmountable task of explaining how the components are related without, for example, undermining the unity of the conscious subject or committing ourselves to systematic causal overdetermination. Aristotle does not have a “two-component view,” but rather thinks that humans and other organisms are “inextricably psycho-physical,” as are their capacities and activities, so there is no problem of explaining the regular connection between, say, desiring revenge and blood boiling: there is simply anger, a distinctive boiling-of-the-blood sort of desire for revenge that makes ineliminable reference in its definition to inseparable psychological and physical features. This method of explaining emotions like fear and anger, which Charles introduces in Chapter 1, is then extended in Chapters 3–6 to desire, perception, imagination, and practical intellect. These chapters feature penetrating analyses and creative proposals. Ancient philosophy specialists, the book’s primary audience, will find them stimulating. Non-specialists, who are less likely to be interested in Charles’s detailed and technical engagement with primary texts, can likely glean enough from the summaries at the end of Chapters 1–6 to be able to appreciate Chapters 7–8, which present Aristotle’s account as a live alternative to current theories. These include other kinds of hylomorphism, non-reductive physicalism, eliminativism, and panpsychism. Charles excels at putting Aristotle into dialog with recent work. These chapters model treating the history of philosophy as philosophy.

Charles employs various textual and theoretical arguments for his conclusions in specific contexts, each of which is independently interesting, but he has a sort of master argument to which he frequently appeals. It is developed in Chapter 2, the book’s longest and most technical, in which Charles presents his distinctive and exciting vision of Aristotle’s hylomorphic metaphysics in general, a vision that is likely to set an agenda for those studying multiple areas of Aristotle’s philosophy. This argument, which principally draws from Physics 2 and Metaphysics 7–8, hinges on what I will call “the per se cause principle,” which is that if x is a per se (rather than incidental) efficient cause of an inextricably enmattered effect, then x is inextricably enmattered. This is a nuanced version of a more familiar principle, the causal closure of the physical. Since Aristotelian forms are, according to Charles, such causes of such effects, these forms themselves are inextricably enmattered. That is to say, Aristotelian forms refer in their definition to matter. (Charles distinguishes between “matter as a principle of form” and “spatially divisible matter” and says that forms refer in their definition only to the former.) For example, Charles argues on the basis of such passages as Physics 2.3, 195b21–25 and Metaphysics 7.7, 1032a32–b14 and 12.4, 1070b28–35 that the skill of the builder, a form, is a per se cause of inextricably enmattered effects, effects that make reference in their definition to such things as bricks and wood, and therefore must itself be inextricably enmattered.[1] With this controversial and interesting interpretation of Aristotle’s hylomorphism in hand, Charles leverages the per se cause principle to do important work throughout the book. Desire, perception, imagination, and practical intellect are per se causes of inextricably enmattered effects and so are themselves inextricably enmattered.

Chapter 3, “Desire and Action,” begins with a post-Cartesian question that Aristotle’s account is then shown to avoid: “how can desire, understood as a psychological phenomenon, move the animal and its body?” (94). According to Aristotle, desire is the per se cause of voluntary bodily movements and to be that kind of cause it must be inextricably psycho-physical rather than purely psychological. In particular, desire is a “heat-involving capacity” (108) that, when actualized, “contains the formula of what the agent is seeking” (107) and is thus capable of “heating the connate pneuma in just the way required to produce the agent’s goal” (108). This avoids a major pitfall of certain ways of accounting for actions according to which while “the features which are causally efficacious (basic per se causes) are purely physical, those available to consciousness or possessed of intentional content, are not” (116). Charles’s point about the danger of separating these features of actions is important. After all, the possibility of deviant causal chains arises if they are indeed separated in this way. His account is meant to recover “the idea of desires themselves as causally efficacious in virtue of their own content.” Although I have taken a different approach to the per se causal relevance of desire in my own article (2019), I enjoyed Charles’s insightful revision of his influential remarks on this subject in his book (1984).

Chapters 4 and 5, which concern perception, likewise begin with the post-Cartesian problem of how to explain the connection between purely psychological awareness of external objects and purely physical occurrences internal to perceivers. Again, Charles contends that Aristotle’s account avoids this problem by rejecting the terms in which it is framed. Perception is not decomposable into separate psychological and physical components, but is instead inextricably psycho-physical. Aristotle’s account of perception “is motivated, once again, by his view of the relevant psychological phenomena (as captured by the form) as per se causes and effects of bodily (or material) processes” (120). This allows him, at least in the case of vision, to espouse an interesting kind of direct realism, one that not only avoids appealing to sense data that can somehow represent the properties of external objects, as Charles says non-reductive materialists do, but also stops short of the claim that perceptual awareness consists only in its properties appearing to the perceiver, which claim Charles attributes to “spiritualists” (190). “Our seeing [an object’s colour] is the same activity as its impacting on us through specific light-based movements in the medium . . . This is why, when all goes well, we see the colour of the object, not an internal object caused by that colour” (191).

Chapter 6 argues that inextricabilism extends to perception of what Aristotle calls “common sensibles,” as well as to imagination and practical thought. Each of these fits into “an integrated picture of how perception in general, common as well as special, leads to bodily action in unified, essentially and inextricably psycho-physical human subjects” (194). As usual, they must refer in their definitions to material features if they are to be per se causes of bodily effects, as they should be, says Charles, if they are, like desire, per se causes of actions.

Emotions, desire, perception, imagination, and practical thought, then, are all such that their per se causal priority to bodily effects entails that they are not causally inert epiphenomena, thus averting the threat of reduction of the psychological to the physical, while their “impure” status, their definitional inextricability from matter, guarantees that psychological items do not exercise an independent causality that would overdetermine physical effects. According to Charles, principles of necessitation other than the per se cause principle are inappropriate for Aristotle’s explanatory purposes. He rebuts various interpretations that offer hypothetical necessity, for example, as an explanation for the regular, and therefore, according to Aristotle, non-coincidental connection between psychological and physical phenomena.

Chapters 7 and 8 are chiefly occupied with situating Aristotle’s account, thus described, among various live options for theorizing the relevant phenomena and exploring the extent to which its viability can be defended.

I will mention two concerns that I had when reading. Charles alleges in the introduction’s first paragraph that “nearly all post-Cartesian philosophers” share problematic assumptions about the nature of, and relationship between, psychological and physical phenomena that Aristotle, properly understood, rejects. But presumably Charles also regards his interpretation of Aristotle as fundamentally discrepant on these points with at least some predating Descartes, such as those of Alexander of Aphrodisias, Aquinas, Averroes, Buridan, Plotinus, Scotus, or Zabarella. (He says that it is concordant in certain respects with that of Suárez, whose remarks he discusses in Chapter 2.) I suspect that many current Aristotle scholars consciously follow the lines of interpretation that they drew and that their agreement with those interpretations is sufficient to explain their patterns of disagreement with Charles. For example, a thoroughgoing Neoplatonist or Thomist is likely to reject Charles’s principal theses, but is this best explained by Descartes’s influence? Charles certainly cannot engage with the entire history of interpretation of Aristotle’s psychology in this book, and so needs some principled way of limiting his dialectical scope, but I often found myself wondering how helpful it is to center the relevant controversies around Descartes.[2] I was less distracted when I focused on Charles’s forceful defense of particular exegetical and theoretical claims and weighed their merits against those of the interpretations with which he seems most interested in contrasting his position: functionalism, non-reductive materialism, and spiritualism, which Charles associates with panpsychism.

My second concern requires a bit more explanation. Those who think that Aristotle countenances purely psychological phenomena are presumably not motivated primarily by his remarks about the phenomena to which Charles devotes nearly all of his attention: emotions, desire, perception, imagination, and, to a lesser extent, practical intellect. Rather, Aristotle’s remarks about theoretical intellect have encouraged many to believe that he takes it to be separable in definition, and perhaps even in existence, from body.

Long before Descartes and down to the present day, various interpreters have understood Aristotle as believing that the theoretical intellect of individual humans is personal, substantial, and immortal (DA 1.4, 408b18–19), extricable from body because it is not the actuality of any body (DA 2.1, 413a6–7), unmixed with body and utterly without a bodily organ (DA 3.4, 429a18–29), uniquely dissociated from bodily activity (GA 2.3, 736b28–29), in short, immortal, separable, and unmixed (DA 3.5, 430a17–24), beyond the purview of natural science (PA 1.1, 641a32–b4), and what a human being is most of all (NE 10.7, 1178a2–7). Each of the passages that are supposed to underpin such claims is highly controversial. I am not here advocating any particular way of understanding them.[3] Rather, I am pointing out that some interpret them as motivating an “idea of the purely psychological” (225) independently of what such interpreters might think about whether other psychological phenomena are separable from bodily phenomena.

It is surprising, then, that Charles spends only a couple of pages on theoretical intellect. In these pages, he stresses the notorious difficulty of Aristotle’s remarks on the subject and restricts himself to tentative proposals. He is in this section very reluctant to attribute to Aristotle the view that theoretical intellect is inextricably enmattered. To be sure, Charles cannot be expected to devote equal attention to every part of Aristotle’s psychological theory, and his discussions of the subjects that he covers are excellent, but I think that his treatment of theoretical intellect, such as it is, creates a problem. Consider this question: What explains the regular connection between, say, the activity of theorizing and the distinctive pleasure (which Charles presumably considers inextricably enmattered) that accompanies it? The regularity of the connection rules out contingent coincidence, according to Aristotle. Are they, then, related by per se causation or by some other kind of necessitation? If by per se causation, theoretical intellect (extricable from matter) presents a counterexample to Charles’s per se cause principle, thus disrupting the deployment of his master argument. (Charles’s more specific arguments for inextricabilism about desire, perception, etc. would not necessarily be affected by this.) Charles has cut off a possible retreat to kinds of necessitation other than per se causation (e.g., hypothetical necessity) by denying them to his opponents as explanatorily insufficient. In short, I fear that Charles’s master argument, if it is to succeed, requires him to say something that he is unwilling to say, namely that theoretical intellect is inextricably enmattered. If Aristotle believed that, then all varieties of dualist interpretation would be mistaken. But if Aristotle did not believe that, then many historical and current interpretations of his psychological theory retain their principal motivation, a motivation that Descartes can hardly have been responsible for introducing.

Another way of putting my concern is this: According to Charles, Aristotle “rejected the idea of the purely psychological used to set up our post-Cartesian mind-body problem” in holding that “Psychological activities, such as are involved in the emotions, desire, and perception, are defined as inextricably psycho-physical . . .” (225) But is the “idea of the purely psychological” 1) the idea that all psychological phenomena are purely psychological or 2) the idea that at least one of them is? Charles’s arguments throughout the book, if successful, show that Aristotle rejects (1), but not that he rejects (2). If (2) has animated many of the interpretations of Aristotle’s psychological theory that Charles resists, as I suspect, then Charles faces pressure to argue that Aristotle rejects (2). (This pressure intensifies if, as some think, Aristotle distinguishes between (1) and (2) in DA 1.1, 403a2–30, asking whether at least one activity of the soul, namely that associated with intellect, is separable from matter even if others are not, and indicates that he will address (2) in his subsequent inquiry.)[4] But arguing that Aristotle rejects (2) would require Charles to endorse inextricabilism about theoretical intellect, which he seems unwilling to do. Without Charles doing so, however, the master argument, dependent as it is upon the generality of the per se cause principle, would be imperiled.

This book best shows its brilliance in its subtle analysis of Aristotle’s remarks on emotion, desire, perception, and imagination, its grand systematizing ambition, and its spirited defense of the credibility of an Aristotelian approach to philosophical psychology. Charles succeeds in laying a simple, elegant theoretical foundation upon which he is then able to erect an intricate edifice of nuanced observations. This achievement is the culmination of decades of thought about some of the most important issues in Aristotle’s philosophical psychology and will be indispensable for those interested in carrying discussion of such issues forward.


I want to thank David Charles, Caleb Cohoe, and Sean Kelsey for their helpful feedback on a draft of this review. I have profited much from discussions with each of them about these topics over the course of years.


Charles, David. 1984. Aristotle’s Philosophy of Action. London: Duckworth.

Charles, David. ed. Forthcoming. The History of Hylomorphism: Aristotle to Boyle. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Cohoe, Caleb. 2022. “The Separability of Nous.” In Aristotle’s On the Soul: A Critical Guide, edited by Caleb Cohoe. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Reece, Bryan C. 2019. “Aristotle’s Four Causes of Action.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 97 (2): 213–227.

Reece, Bryan C. 2020. “Aristotle on Divine and Human Contemplation.” Ergo: An Open-Access Journal of Philosophy 7:131–160.

Reece, Bryan C. Forthcoming. Aristotle on Happiness, Virtue, and Wisdom. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.


[1] Charles’s deployment of this example for general conclusions about hylomorphism requires taking the builder’s skill itself, which is a form, rather than, say, the builder qualified as skilled, as the most precisely specified efficient cause. I have argued against Charles’s interpretation of the relevant passages and for an alternative in my (2019).

[2] Readers interested in learning more from Charles about the relevance of figures other than Descartes in the history of interpretation of Aristotle’s psychological theory can look forward to his introduction in (Charles, forthcoming).

[3] In the final chapters of my (forthcoming) I address the relationship between theoretical and practical intellect and their relevance for determining the nature of the self. My (2020) discusses divine and human intellect. Both of these engage extensively with Charles’s work on these topics. (Cohoe 2022) is a clear and very recent presentation of arguments based on some of the passages mentioned above for the separability of theoretical intellect.

[4] Thanks to Caleb Cohoe for this point about DA 1.1.