The Unity of Plato's Gorgias: Rhetoric, Justice, and the Philosophic Life

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Devin Stauffer, The Unity of Plato's Gorgias: Rhetoric, Justice, and the Philosophic Life, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 191pp., $75.00, ISBN 052185847X.

Reviewed by Jessica Moss, University of Pittsburgh


This book calls for "a close, painstaking, and open-minded reading of each of Plato's dialogues" (182), and offers just such a reading of the Gorgias. It also presents, as the title promises, a unifying account of the dialogue: on Stauffer's view, the central theme is Socrates' subtle, indirect appeal to Gorgias to join him in the construction of "true rhetoric," a new and noble form of rhetoric that will aid Socrates' own practice of philosophy by protecting philosophy from its hostile critics.

The book is certainly a model of the kind of reading it calls for: careful, sometimes even hesitant analysis that pays attention to every detail and strives to avoid "arbitrariness of interpretation, which is the result of taking passages out of context and imposing on Plato's writing a structure that is not their own" (8). (Stauffer notes his debts to Jacob Klein, Leo Strauss, and Seth Benardete, and one feels their influence at points very strongly.) Those accustomed to the style of philosophical writing Stauffer is here condemning may grow frustrated at the book's leisurely pace. Stauffer goes through the dialogue almost line by line, with the result that the book is full of observations that, while suggestive, contribute little to the main argument, and he is so loath to impose a foreign structure on the dialogue that he sometimes seems compelled to comment even where he has little to add to previous discussions. But the attention to detail is at points very rewarding, and Stauffer provides us with an important lesson in how to read Plato. Whether or not, when the time comes to write, one chooses to adopt the style Stauffer recommends, one will do well first to have asked oneself the kinds of questions he asks on nearly every page: Why does Socrates abruptly change the topic in this place, and only return to his initial question many pages later? Why does he not draw the obvious conclusion at this other point? Why does he here argue from a premise for which he's given no justification?

As to Stauffer's main thesis -- that throughout the dialogue Socrates is implicitly appealing to Gorgias to help him in the construction of true rhetoric -- it is certainly controversial, at least in the way he develops it. It will be helpful, in evaluating the thesis, to divide it into three main claims.

First, the Gorgias' Socrates does not straightforwardly condemn rhetoric: although strongly critical of rhetoric as actually practiced in contemporary Athens, he explores the possibility that some new form of rhetoric -- which he calls "true rhetoric" at 517a -- could be used in the service of philosophy. Stauffer's arguments for this claim are compelling, and the point seems exactly right, so much so that it should be beyond controversy. (It is not: Stauffer cites many authors who ignore Socrates' more positive comments about rhetoric, along with several who recognize them.) One strength of this reading is that it gives us a clear way to link the Gorgias to the Phaedrus, where Socrates prescribes and outlines a philosophical art of rhetoric, but Stauffer does not discuss the Phaedrus at all, perhaps on the principle that comparisons across dialogues somehow undermine the kind of close reading he favors. This is an unfortunate omission: discussion of the art of rhetoric Socrates outlines in the Phaedrus would certainly have strengthened this first claim, and perhaps influenced the way he goes on to develop it.

Second, Socrates wants Gorgias' help in the task of constructing true rhetoric, which would thus represent a sort of alliance between philosophy and what Socrates condemns as "flattering" rhetoric. This claim is, I think, more surprising and more difficult to establish, and it is here that Stauffer's careful attention to detail is particularly rewarding. He tracks Gorgias' appearances throughout the dialogue, showing us when and how he intervenes or is appealed to during the Polus and Callicles episodes, and in doing so makes clear that Gorgias' involvement is far from over at the end of his own conversation with Socrates. The combined weight of these observations goes a long way toward showing that Gorgias is in some sense Socrates' target throughout the dialogue. Stauffer also argues persuasively that Socrates softens his tone toward Gorgianic rhetoric over the course of the dialogue, by drawing detailed comparisons between the initial discussion of flattering knacks at 463a ff. and the second discussion, at 517c ff. (One would like to know why Socrates began so harshly, if seducing Gorgias is his aim, but Stauffer does not address this question.)

As part of this second claim, Stauffer wants to show not merely that Socrates is trying to gain Gorgias' friendship, but also that he is, in his interactions with Polus and Callicles, somehow preparing Gorgias for the task of developing true rhetoric. Socrates reveals that Polus has more respect for justice than he at first admits, and thus that he is a candidate for "reform;" Plato writes flaws into Socrates' refutation of Polus, however, to show that Socrates cannot do the job on his own and is implicitly appealing for help: "If Socrates has been unable to fully complete that reform, might that be a job for Gorgias? Has Socrates been preparing Gorgias for a new task by revealing to him the true concerns and needs of men such as Polus?" (80). Stauffer is not the first to notice flaws in Socrates' argument against Polus, but his explanation for them is novel.

His analysis of the conversation with Callicles is much the same: again Socrates is revealing in his interlocutor a hidden respect for justice, and again his ultimate purpose is the "education of Gorgias in a nobler form of rhetoric" (122). Here, however, the analysis is more problematic. Stauffer, like others before him, recognizes that Callicles is more ambivalent towards traditional values than his avowal of hedonism and scorn for convention imply. But his account of the source of this ambivalence is far-fetched: Callicles wants to think of himself as an amoral hedonist not because he genuinely admires and emulates ruthless, self-serving, powerful types, but because "to admit that one is concerned with virtue, and that one has a deep desire to see virtue triumph, is to open oneself to sorrow and anger when virtue fails or is defeated by vice" (117). The textual evidence for this interpretation is thin, and here, as elsewhere in the book, one wishes that Stauffer would defend his reading by engaging in direct argument with opposing interpretations. (Recent literature offers several compelling analyses of Callicles' inner conflict: see Charles Kahn, "Drama and Dialectic in Plato's Gorgias", Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy I (1983): 75-121, Robert Wardy, The Birth of Rhetoric (Routledge, 1996) and Raphael Woolf, "Callicles and Socrates: Psychic (Dis)harmony in the Gorgias," Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy XVIII (2000): 1-40; these last two are notable absences from Stauffer's bibliography.)

The third claim of the main thesis is the most controversial and, I think, least successful. This is that the purpose of true rhetoric is to protect philosophy -- and Socrates in particular -- from public hostility, by portraying philosophy in a flattering light. Its "ultimate purpose is the defense of philosophy against its critics and potential enemies" (122); "Socrates is interested in a new form of rhetoric, above all, because he is interested in somehow mitigating the danger he is in" from philosophy's enemies (166). That is, Socrates is seeking literal protection from the kind of fate he will in fact meet: death at the hands of a hostile public.

Can Plato really mean us to think that Socrates is out to save his own skin? This looks blatantly out of keeping with Socrates' own overt comments on the supreme importance of virtue and the lesser value of life itself, and Stauffer does very little to mitigate the impression that he is saddling Socrates with distinctly unSocratic concerns. He footnotes two passages from the Apology that are supposed to show that "Socrates was not as disparaging of the concern for self-protection as he sometimes suggests" (148): Apology 32e-33a and 31c-32c, where Socrates says that had he been more involved in public affairs, he would have been killed long ago. But it is one thing to show that Socrates is aware that doing philosophy on a more public scale would endanger his life, and another to show that he wants to do philosophy on a more public scale and wants to do so without endangering his life; it seems to me that Socrates' self-presentation both in the Apology and in the Gorgias count against this latter interpretation. Meanwhile, much of Stauffer's argument rests on a very odd interpretation of Socrates' stance towards the principle that what matters for one's happiness above all is being just. Stauffer puts a great deal of weight on the fact that Socrates holds out the theoretical possibility that this view might be refuted (508a-b), and that he denies actually knowing it to be true (509a); he takes these typically Socratic caveats to indicate "doubts about Socrates' own acceptance" of the principle, and suggests that this should "also lead us to doubt that he truly takes self-protection as lightly as he seems to" (148-149). But do Socrates' very Socratic denials of knowledge really show that he has doubts about the value of justice, that he worries that a good man can, after all, be harmed?

Moreover, this focus on self-protection for its own sake seems to ignore or at least drastically downplay Socrates' more familiar concerns. In the Apology passage Stauffer mentions, Socrates says that had he died he "would have benefited neither you nor myself" (31d-e); in a similar passage from the Republic, Socrates says that in a city like Athens a philosopher who meddles in public affairs would die "before he could profit the city or his friends, without benefiting himself or other" (Republic 496d). Both passages indicate that if Socrates wants to survive, it is so that he can benefit people, himself included, by bringing them closer to virtue. The brief description of true rhetoric Socrates offers in the Gorgias suggests the same: Socrates speaks of it as "redirecting appetites… towards that which would make the citizens better" (517b). Stauffer acknowledges that "'true rhetoric' aims at taming the citizens or making them gentler," but adds that "at least one reason for doing so is to provide safety for its practitioners" (155), without ever mentioning any other reasons besides this one. But surely when Socrates speaks of making people better, and in particular of moderating their appetites -- the Gorgias, after all, defines vice largely in terms of disorderly appetites (see 493d-e and 504b-505b) -- he has in mind the benefit of their souls, i.e. the inculcation of virtue, for its own sake. (Does Stauffer mean to rule this out with his suggestion that philosophical rhetoric as Socrates conceives it will not make people "become philosophic" (179)? One would like to know more than he offers here.) Perhaps the main problem here is one of presentation: we would like to know how Socrates' alleged concern for his own survival, or for the protection of philosophy in general, relates to the concerns that are more recognizably his.

Stauffer ends his book by drawing back from the drama of the dialogue to consider what his interpretation can tell us about Plato's "literary-rhetorical project." Here he tells us that the Socrates of the dialogue knows all along that an alliance with Gorgias is "at best a long shot" (180); Socrates' true rhetorical ally is Plato himself. "For didn't Plato himself accomplish what Socrates had in mind?", to wit, "winning a place of high esteem for Socrates and for Socratic philosophy in the hearts and minds of future generations" (181). This attempt to connect the concerns internal to the dialogues with Plato's project in writing them is a real strength of the book, and what Stauffer has to say here is worth careful consideration. One wonders, however, how much of the book's more controversial claims this final conclusion renders unnecessary. If Socrates knows all along that Gorgias is not the right ally for him, why insist that many of the dialogue's more complex arguments aim at "educating" him? And if Plato can accomplish what Socrates wants done even by doing it after Socrates' death, why cast doubt on Socrates' conviction that it is the just life, not life for its own sake, that is alone worth living?