The Universe As We Find it

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John Heil, The Universe As We Find it, Oxford University Press, 2012, 306pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199596201.

Reviewed by Chad Carmichael, Indiana University-Purdue University Indianapolis


In this ambitious work, John Heil presents a fundamental ontology (chapters 1-8) consisting of finitely many substances and their properties (which he thinks of as particular, trope-like things), together with an account of causation, truthmaking, and a chapter on relations generally. He then applies this ontology (chapters 9-12) to a number of outstanding problems about reductionism, kinds, essences, emergence, consciousness, cognition, and much else. A final chapter reprises the main points about fundamental ontology from the first chapters.

It is impossible to do justice to such a wide-ranging book in a review. I will focus on a handful of the interesting ontological theses from the book, since the ontology takes center stage in Heil's own presentation. In particular, I will discuss his view of substances, his view that properties are powerful qualities, and his views on the scope and aims of ontology. But I emphasize that the book contains much else of interest, especially the theory of emergence (2.6-2.7), the argument that property similarity is "brute" (5.4), and the chapter on the relationship between conscious thought and mental images (chapter 12).

Substances and Their Parts

Heil characterizes substances as things that bear properties. He also says that substances are simple, and that only substances bear properties. The conjunction of these claims will initially be met with incredulity: my body and hand both bear properties and are therefore substances by this account, but my body is not simple, since it has my hand as a part. And surely, if there are properties, then they have properties (such as the property of being a property) even though they are non-substances. However, such objections are misdirected. For, although Heil is less explicit about this than he could be, his discussion is pretty clearly guided by a conception of substances as non-dependent entities, and a conception of properties as properties of non-dependent entities. (Heil is clear that he accepts the existence, though not the fundamental existence, of what he calls "quasi-substances" such as hands, and "quasi-properties" such as the shape of my hand.) So interpreted, Heil's claim that only substances bear properties becomes the trivial claim that only non-dependent entities bear properties of non-dependent entities. The claim that substances are simple, on the other hand, becomes the interesting claim that all non-dependent entities are simple. By 'simple', Heil means that these items do not have substances as proper parts. So his claim is that non-dependent entities never have other non-dependent entities as proper parts. Let's call this thesis substance nihilism.

We may highlight the importance of substance nihilism by placing it adjacent to Heil's claim (p. 51) that it is up to science to discover whether the substances are in fact particles, fields, or even the whole of space-time. For suppose that science reveals -- perhaps in line with the sorts of arguments about quantum entanglement offered in Schaffer (2010) -- that the whole of space-time is a substance. Then this discovery, together with substance nihilism, would entail Schaffer's priority monism, according to which all physical objects depend upon the whole of space-time. Alternatively, a discovery that fundamental particles are substances would, in conjunction with substance nihilism, entail priority micro-physicalism: that everything other than fundamental particles depends on fundamental particles.

Heil's argument for substance nihilism (section 2.4) is as follows. Consider an object with proper parts, such as a tomato. Truthmakers for truths about the tomato involve substances (particles, let us assume) that are distinct from the tomato. As a result, for the tomato to be a certain way just is for the tomato's constituting particles to have the properties that they have. For example, for the tomato to have mass is for its constituting particles to have the specific masses that they have. In light of this, Heil claims, each particle has mass in a different sense of 'has' than the merely derived sense in which the tomato has mass. As Heil puts it: "the sense in which a simple substance bears a property . . . does not extend univocally to complexes made up of substances standing in particular relations." To suggest otherwise, Heil says, "has the aura of a category mistake." Thus, objects with substantial parts have properties only in a derived sense. From here, Heil infers that substances have no substantial parts (i.e., substance nihilism).

It is not wholly clear how to understand this last inference. Heil does not provide any connecting premises. But one could perhaps reason as follows. If a substance can have a substantial part, then (just as with the tomato) it will end up bearing some property in the derived sense. But, as with the tomato, this would mean that some truths about this substance are made true by truthmakers involving its substantial part. However, things depend on objects involved in the truthmakers that make claims about them true. So substances with substantial parts would be dependent entities. Since substances are non-dependent, substance nihilism follows.

So elaborated, the argument is open to several objections. First, it is not true that each thing must depend on those objects which are involved in truthmakers that make claims about them true. For example, suppose that 'There is a spy at the party' is made true by the fact that Ortcutt is a spy and is at the party. This sentence is a truth about the party, but it obviously doesn't follow that the party depends upon Ortcutt.

One could try to fix the argument by weakening the relevant premise to read that each object depends on the things involved in truthmakers for existential truths about that object. Thus, the tomato would depend on its particles, since they would be involved in the truthmaker for the claim that the tomato exists. One could then claim that substantial parts of a thing are always involved in truthmakers for existential claims about that thing. Substance nihilism follows.

The problem now is that the above claim about substantial parts effectively begs the question. If you were skeptical of substance nihilism, you would almost certainly be equally skeptical of this claim, which falls far short of being obvious.  Additionally, it is doubtful that the tomato depends on its particles. We normally think that a tomato can survive the annihilation of one of its particles. But it seems to be false that a thing can exist in the absence of something on which it ontologically depends in the relevant sense, as Heil himself suggests (section 3.1).

These objections concern my elaboration of Heil's argument. But three additional objections can be raised to his specific statements. The first concerns Heil's claim that having a property derivatively is having in a different sense than having it non-derivatively. Not every different condition under which one may instantiate a property involves a distinct notion of instantiation: I have mass after dinner and I have mass after lunch, but it is implausible that these are different senses of 'have'. Why then should we suppose that having mass derivatively involves a different sense of 'having' than having mass non-derivatively? It is not clear that we should.

The second concerns the starting point of the argument: that science will reveal a world of substances. Given that substances are non-dependent beings, this is, in effect, saying that science is committed a priori to a fundamental level of reality. This is a weak point in Heil's argument, since an opponent may reasonably deny his claim (see Schaffer 2003), and Heil provides no argument for it.

The third concerns the relationship between Heil's substance nihilism and his conception of truthmakers. Heil talks about truthmakers in several ways: sometimes they are arrangements of substances, sometimes they are "ways the universe is," and sometimes they are such entities as this electron's having mass. Heil does not discuss the question whether these things are substances. But given that they loom large in his ontology, which is advertised to comprise only substances and their properties, it is natural to think that they are substances. And yet, each of these things plausibly has substantial parts.

Properties, Qualities, and Powers

The centerpiece of Heil's theory of properties, and a key element of his treatment of the problem of consciousness in the later chapters, concerns the relationship between properties and their causal powers. He describes the current debate between those who think that properties are qualities that are contingently associated with causal powers, on the one hand, and those who think that properties are not qualities but pure powers, on the other. But Heil himself rejects both of these views. Instead, he regards properties as powerful qualities, understood as qualitative properties that have their causal powers of necessity. On Heil's view, then, an electron's charge is not only a quality of the electron, but also a causal power or disposition to behave in certain ways under certain circumstances.

There's a difficulty in understanding what 'quality' means here. There aren't any uncontroversial examples of qualities, as some of Heil's opponents claim that the nature of every property is exhausted by its causal powers. What then is the nature of a property, according to Heil, over and above its disposition to cause various effects? Heil says that qualities are supposed to have further intrinsic natures that "leave room" for "Technicolour vistas" or "experienced boomings and buzzings" (p. 63). However, I fear that this answer leaves the central challenge posed by the "pure powers" view largely unaddressed: the challenge of articulating what we add to a property when, in addition to recognizing its causal powers, we call it qualitative. If Heil thought that qualities were contingently associated with their powers, he could perhaps get us onto the idea of a quality by describing a possible world in which intuitively distinct qualities have the same causal powers. But, if qualities just are powers (as Heil claims), then this would seem to be impossible, as qualitative differences will be differences in powers.

Another controversial aspect of Heil's view is that he accepts the necessity of the laws of nature (he believes that this follows from his view that properties have their causal powers necessarily). There is, of course, an illusion of contingency in the laws, as evidenced by an example of Peter Unger's that Heil discusses. In the example, we are to imagine a world of blue and yellow spheres, together with laws specifying that blue spheres and yellow spheres are mutually attracting. In this case, we might have a strong intuition that the causal power to attract yellow spheres is only contingently associated with the property of being a blue sphere. But Heil's suggestion is that the case, as we have described it, is impossible. Heil's view is that there is a possible case, easily confused with the described impossible case, in which it is not yellowness, but "some reciprocal power that contingently covaries with yellowness" (p. 76) that accounts for the attraction.

Let's call this "reciprocal power" yellowness*. One worry (due to Fine 2002) about this sort of move on behalf of law necessitarians is that, whereas it rescues the necessity of the relevant "attraction" law, we now have a different seemingly contingent law in its place: the law that there are no merely yellow (as opposed to yellow*) things. If this is right, Heil might be in error to suggest that his powerful qualities view entails the necessity of the laws -- a relief to those of us that might find Heil's theory otherwise plausible while finding law necessitarianism unbelievable.

Ontology and Fundamentality

Throughout the book, Heil encourages us to avoid what he calls "linguisticized metaphysics." He wants to leave behind considerations of how we talk and otherwise represent the world, and instead look at the world itself, as it fundamentally is. The focus is on fundamental ontology, or serious ontology as he sometimes calls it, and not with non-fundamental matters.

I am enthusiastic supporter of the idea that there is much interesting philosophy to be done that concerns what is fundamental, and I agree with Heil that there is little reason to think that you can read the fundamental nature of reality off of ordinary discourse. However, Heil does not argue for his view that there are no regular existence questions of ontological interest. For example, the puzzles and difficulties that can be raised about persons, tables, ships, and the like, have led some philosophers (mereological nihilists) to deny that they exist at all. Providing answers to the challenges posed by these philosophers seems to me an important and interesting philosophical task -- comparable to answering the skeptic in epistemology -- that is reasonably regarded as ontology, and even serious ontology, but clearly isn't a part of fundamental ontology.

Furthermore, Heil himself seems to be inextricably embroiled in ontological questions about non-fundamental things. For example, he is clear that he thinks "quasi-substances" such as ships and desks are to be had on the cheap -- they are "no addition of being," as he says. Presumably, then, Heil accepts unrestricted composition for ordinary objects, and would embrace the existence of an object composed of my nose and the Eiffel Tower. What then would he say about the intuition that there simply is no such object? Would he endorse Lewis's reply that the quantifier in the intuition is simply restricted? What then would he say to the various objections to that approach in the literature? Philosophers -- serious ontologists, no less -- argue about these sorts of things, and provide interesting and often illuminating theories of these non-fundamental phenomena.

Or consider Heil's theory of properties. As I have indicated, in addition to properties of fundamental substances, Heil also accepts the existence of what he calls "quasi-properties" that apply to non-substances -- properties like the color and shape of a tomato. Heil says very little about the nature of these quasi-properties, partly because he thinks that ontology should not be concerned with them. But there are philosophically interesting and important questions here. For example, is there a quasi-property for every open sentence, including 'x is a quasi-property that does not apply to itself'? Are quasi-properties abstract, or can they have locations in space? Are there complex quasi-properties? What of the quasi-property of being in pain -- does it have any causal powers? I see no reason not to regard these questions as ontologically interesting, especially given that Heil admits (pp. 151-152) that quasi-properties may play a role in completed science. Addressing these questions does not (and should not) stop us from also addressing the question of what is fundamental.

Heil's focus on fundamental ontology is welcome, and perhaps he is right that this part of the subject has a certain priority. He's right that philosophy has neglected the topic over the last several decades (though not, I think, in recent years). But I'm unconvinced -- and Heil offers no argument -- that these questions about non-fundamental matters are unimportant in ontology.


Thanks to Dan Korman and John Tilley for very helpful comments.


Fine, Kit. 2002. The Varieties of Necessity. In Tamar Szabo Gendler and John Hawthorne (eds.), Conceivability and Possibility, Oxford.

Schaffer, Jonathan. 2003. Is There a Fundamental Level? Nous 37: 498-517.

Schaffer, Jonathan. 2010. Monism: The Priority of the Whole. Philosophical Review 119: 31-76.