The Universe of Things: On Speculative Realism

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Steven Shaviro, The Universe of Things: On Speculative Realism, Minnesota University Press, 2014, 180pp., $20.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780816689262.

Reviewed by Jeffrey A. Bell, Southeastern Louisiana University


Steven Shaviro sets out to accomplish two main tasks that serve as a basis for many interesting arguments and connections. First and foremost, Shaviro sets out to defend a version of philosophical realism, or what has come to be called speculative realism whereby what is asserted is not simply the claim that there is a reality independent of our perceptions, thoughts, and opinions regarding this reality, but rather the much more provocative claim that this reality provokes speculation. Shaviro is quite forthright on this point: "any true realism must be speculative. . . . Confronted with the real, we are compelled to speculate . . . we must think outside our own thought, and we must positively conceive the existence of things outside our own conceptions of them" (67). Secondly, to lay out his own version of speculative realism, he draws upon the work of Alfred North Whitehead to set up the contrast between his Whitehead-inspired arguments and the arguments one finds among the philosophers most commonly associated with speculative realism. Shaviro announces his intentions from the beginning when he claims that his "book takes a new look at the philosophy of Whitehead in the light of a number of recent developments in continental philosophy that can be grouped under the rubrics of 'speculative realism'" (1). These recent developments in continental philosophy include the work of, among others, Graham Harman, Quentin Meillassoux, and Ray Brassier. The subsequent chapters are largely structured around a critical survey and reinterpretation (or 'translation' in Bruno Latour's sense of the term, a term Shaviro himself adopts) of this work in light of Whitehead's own avant la lettre speculative realist philosophy.

The most significant parallel between Whitehead and the speculative realists, on Shaviro's account, follows directly from Whitehead's critique of the bifurcation of nature. When it comes to the bifurcation between the phenomenal appearances of "the red glow of the sunset" and the physical reality of "'the molecules and electric waves' of sunlight refracting into the earth's atmosphere", Whitehead is quite clear in arguing that one is not more real than the other. To the contrary, for Whitehead "we may not pick and choose". The red glow of the sunset and the electric waves of sunlight each have for Whitehead, as Shaviro points out, "the same ontological status" (2). Stated differently, nature is not divided between material things that are inaccessible to us except insofar as they are taken up by the mind in the form of impressions and ideas; rather, things are always already present in other things. Whitehead is clear on this point: "an actual entity is present in other actual entities" (Process and Reality, 50; cited 8). From here we are immediately on the doorstep of a common theme among many of the speculative realist philosophers -- namely, their critique of correlationism, or the view that is traced to Kant whereby we cannot think the nature of objects as they are in-themselves but can only think objects by way of the representations of objects. The nature of reality, therefore, is always correlated with another process (e.g., representational thought) and is never given as it is in-itself but always as something given to a subject. As Meillassoux states what could be called the correlationist problem, "one cannot think the in-itself without entering into a vicious circle, thereby immediately contradicting oneself' (cited 7). One of the central premises upon which the arguments in Shaviro's book develop is that Whitehead's efforts to avoid the bifurcation of nature provide a different way of addressing and resolving this correlationist problem.

The Whiteheadean distinction that Shaviro makes most use of in showing how the bifurcation of nature can be avoided is the distinction between self-enjoyment and concern. Self-enjoyment, Shaviro argues, "is 'absolute' in that it unfolds entirely in itself and for itself, without conditions" (14), and this with respect to life whereby "Every moment of life is an autonomous 'self-creation'" (14, citing Modes of Thought, 151). The enjoyment of life, in other words, is absolute and not relative to anything other than the process of life itself. All occasions, Whitehead argues, involve this absolute self-enjoyment. At the same time, occasions also entail a concern for other occasions, for occasions that may become relevant -- through what Whitehead calls prehension -- to an occasion's own autonomous process of 'self-creation'. As Shaviro puts it, "Concern is relational, rather than absolute, and allo-affective, rather than auto-affective" (15). To avoid falling back into another version of the bifurcation of nature, Shaviro shows that the self-enjoyment/concern distinction is a patterned contrast rather than a polar opposition, and it is here where he argues that Whitehead's concern for aesthetics emerges -- that is, aesthetics involves relationships that are irreducible to the polar oppositions one finds exemplified in the bifurcation of nature. It is for this reason, among others, that Shaviro will argue, agreeing with Harman, though for different reasons, that aesthetics is first philosophy (13).

Of the speculative realist philosophers Shaviro discusses, the work of Harman looms largest. In fact, it is fair to say that Harman is Shaviro's primary interlocutor, and it is through his engagement with Harman's work that Shaviro is able to establish his own contrasting arguments regarding speculative realism. The primary point of contention between Shaviro and Harman concerns the reality of relations. Following Whitehead, Shaviro argues that all occasions are in relations with other occasions, or there is both autonomous, auto-affective self-enjoyment and allo-affective concern for other occasions. Harman, by contrast, argues that objects are isolated, hermetically sealed substances that are withdrawn from all relations. As Shaviro states Harman's argument, "Every object retains a hidden reserve of being, one that is never exhausted by and never fully expressed in its contacts with other objects" (30). The resulting problem for Harman, Shaviro claims, "is to account for how two entities, isolated as they are from one another, can ever possibly enter into contact" (33). Shaviro's problem is quite different. By accepting the Whiteheadean contrast of self-enjoyment and concern, and the relations this contrast entails, the problem becomes one of determining "how to get away from these ubiquitious relations" (34) and find the space and elbow room necessary for autonomous self-creation and self-enjoyment.

The problem with Harman's commitment to the withdrawal of objects from relations, as Shaviro sees it, is that it is inconsistent with Harman's approval of "actualism" (37). Harman, Shaviro argues, is in agreement with Whitehead's claim that "there is nothing which floats into the world from nowhere. Everything in the actual world is referable to some actual entity" (Process and Reality, 244; cited 37). It is for this reason that Harman "rejects all philosophies of 'the potential' or 'the virtual'" (37). By arguing for objects that are withdrawn from relations, however, objects with "a hidden reserve of being . . . that is never exhausted by and never fully expressed in its contacts with other objects," Shaviro does not see "why Harman's own doctrine of hidden properties should not be subject to the same critique." In short, how is Harman's philosophy not simply another version of the philosophies of 'the potential' or 'the virtual'?

Shaviro, by contrast, will accept the idea that there is more to reality than what is actually given or present to us -- "Things are active and interactive far beyond any measure of their presence to us" (49). This surplus or excess, however, is not a hidden reserve withdrawn from relations but is instead an excess of relations that cannot be captured and constrained within a predetermining set of normative categories and objective types. The goal for philosophy, Shaviro claims, is therefore "not to deduce and impose cognitive norms, or concepts of understanding, but rather to make us more fully aware of how reality escapes and upsets these norms" (67). This is again why when we do philosophy "we are compelled to speculate," for when we are "confronted with the real" this reality escapes our "cognitive norms, or concepts" and puts us into a situation where "we must think outside our own thought" (67). We are forced into doing philosophy as speculative realism, and speculative realism, if done right, "must maintain," as Shaviro sees it, "both a positive ontological thesis and a positive epistemological one" (68). The ontological thesis asserts that "the real not only exists without us and apart from our conceptualizations of it but is actually organized or articulated in some manner, in its own right, without any help from us" (68); and the epistemological thesis claims that "it is in some way possible for us to point to, and speak about, this organized world-without-us without thereby reducing it yet again to our own conceptual schemes" (68).

Shaviro's strategy in providing both a positive ontological and epistemological thesis is to push the anti-correlationist arguments one finds among speculative realist philosophers to their logical conclusion. Underlying these arguments is perhaps the central claim of his book: that "all entities have insides as well as outsides, or first-person experiences as well as observable, third-person properties" (104). For Shaviro, "the problem with Harman is that he seems to underestimate this latter aspect," the public, third-person aspect of entities. By accepting the two-sided nature of entities, Shaviro adopts a form of panpsychism, and one of the motivations for this move is that it responds to an alternative approach one finds among speculative realists whereby they overcome the problem of correlationism by purging thought from being (see 73). Both Meillassoux and Brassier, for instance, offer a version of this argument. Meillassoux calls for a version of the distinction between primary and secondary qualities in order to show how an object can be "formulated in mathematical terms . . . (and hence) can be meaningfully conceived as properties of the object in itself" (citing Meillassoux, 74). Brassier goes even further and argues that our thought, including mathematical thought, "is epiphenomenal, illusory, and entirely without efficacy" (74). Whether a meaningful grasp of objects as they are in themselves is possible or not, both Meillassoux and Brassier are agreed on one thing, according to Shaviro, and that is "that they both assume that matter in itself -- as it exists outside of the correlation -- must simply be passive and inert, utterly devoid of meaning or value" (77). Thought and matter are thus put into polar opposition with one another -- or Meillassoux and Brassier continue to assume the validity of the bifurcation of nature (77) -- whereas Shaviro, following Whitehead, calls for a contrast of thought and matter, a contrast wherein everything entails both a subjective aspect and an objective aspect, an inside and an outside.

How can one extend thought or an inside to all things -- embrace panpsychism, in other words -- without at the same time falling back into the bifurcation of nature from which one wanted to extricate oneself? The short answer for Shaviro is that we need to push the anticorrelationist arguments to the point where thought and sentience are no longer assumed to be an intentional thought, or an intentional consciousness, as understood by Husserl, for instance, where consciousness is always consciousness of something. When Shaviro argues that Brassier and Meillassoux "aren't anticorrelationist enough," therefore, this is because they continue to assume that thought always involves an intentional relationship to things beyond or outside this thought, a relationship that fails to be successful and hence meaningful for Brassier and is only meaningful by way of mathematical formalism for Meillassoux. If we push anticorrelationism far enough, then we also abandon the correlation between an intentional thought and its objective correlate. We have what Shaviro calls "noncorrelational sentience," (133) an "immanent, noncognitive contact" (148) or "contact at a distance" (147), which Shaviro claims we are to think of "as a sort of sensibility, or sensitivity, without knowledge and without phenomenological intentionality" (147). We have, in short, an aesthetic appreciation that is irreducible to being understood in terms of the bifurcation of nature; and with this move, as well, we find Shaviro returning to Whitehead's claim "that 'the teleology of the Universe is directed to the production of Beauty'" (Adventures of Ideas, 265; cited 20).

Let me close with a brief critical comment. Shaviro has done an excellent job showing how it is precisely aesthetics that is the branch of philosophy that takes seriously the view that "reality escapes and upsets" our cognitive norms, leading us to speculate and "think outside our own thought" (67). A guiding premise of these arguments, however, is that thought is always finite and limited. Shaviro is straightforward on this point: "I accept Kant's insistence on finitude. There is no such thing as absolute knowledge" (136). If a central concern of speculative realists is to move beyond the correlationism one finds in Kant, however, then why not push anticorrelationism full stop and not only move beyond the epistemological correlationism Shaviro critically examines so masterfully in this book, but also move beyond the aesthetic correlationism Shaviro ultimately comes to support -- that is, the aesthetic correlation of a finite entity with the reality that exceeds, "escapes and upsets" this finite entity? Why not allow that for everything there are two sides, as Shaviro argues, but unlike Shaviro this would be in the tradition of Spinoza where these sides entail the absolute and infinite on one side and the relative and finite on the other. These arguments have been developed among philosophers with close affinities to speculative realism. Bergson, for instance, calls for an absolute knowledge in his An Introduction to Metaphysics, and Deleuze will argue for the inseparability of the infinite and absolute from the finite and relative, drawing from Bergson at key points as he does so. Shaviro does refer to Deleuze in the final pages when he points to Deleuze's claim that there is an "object that provokes thought without letting itself be thought" (154), an object that is not a phenomenological correlate of thought. If one unpacks the nature of this object, however, one finds that rather than being in line with the speculative realism that still traces its roots to Kant and to Kant's embrace of finitude and limits, we have instead what one might call a dogmatic realism that traces its roots to Spinoza and to Spinoza's embrace of the infinite and the absolute.

This critical suggestion aside, Shaviro has done a tremendous service by detailing in clear and precise prose the key tenets and developments of what has come to be known as the "speculative realist" tradition in contemporary continental philosophy. Shaviro has also given new life to the work of Whitehead by showing how Whitehead's philosophy is of continuing relevance to the concerns of speculative realists, among others (e.g., those interested in panpsychism). For both these reasons, Shaviro's book will likely be a standard reference and a useful guide for many years to come.