The Uses of the Past From Heidegger to Rorty: Doing Philosophy Historically

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Robert Piercey, The Uses of the Past From Heidegger to Rorty: Doing Philosophy Historically, Cambridge UP, 2009, 221pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521517539.

Reviewed by Paul A. Roth, University of California-Santa Cruz



Philosophy of history has been undergoing a revival in recent years after languishing too long at the margins of the discipline. Its themes include historical explanation, the reality of the past, history as a science — in short, issues attending explanations of what now remains and what happened previously. How the reconstruction of a history influences an understanding of the present, and implicitly how one’s understanding of the present shapes one’s reconstruction of the past, emerge as the central themes of Robert Piercey’s account of what he terms “doing philosophy historically”. As he states at the outset, “the aim of this book, then, is to understand the nature of the activity that we call doing philosophy historically and to describe this activity’s distinguishing features” (2). That this represents a distinctive philosophical approach Piercey has no doubts: "It [doing philosophy historically] has a distinctive object … It also employs a distinctive method and has a different set of goals" (ibid.). The burden the book thus assumes consists of making good on these three claims.

Piercey undertakes this task by developing an initial outline of what he takes doing philosophy historically to be (Chapters 1-3), and then filling in the outline with three case studies that he claims exemplify the theory in practice. Thus, Chapter 4 examines what he terms the “critical approach” of Alasdair MacIntyre, Chapter 5 details the “diagnostic approach” attributed to Martin Heidegger, and Chapter 6 offers what Piercey terms Paul Ricoeur’s “synthetic approach”. If successful, Piercey could be credited with identifying and characterizing a genre of philosophical inquiry that has grown and prospered in the last century. Indeed, this genre has emerged, it would seem, without much notice being taken or (and especially) any appreciation being given (see 3-5).

Piercey portrays doing philosophy historically as a meta-philosophical endeavor. He writes, “But its goal — or at any rate, its hope — is to broaden our conception of what philosophy is” (8). What exactly does Piercey imagine has passed under the philosophical radar? For certainly at least two of Piercey’s own examples — Rorty and Heidegger — hardly make it a secret that “overcoming the tradition” in philosophy lies on their agendas. What links the philosophers whom Piercey discusses involves not their philosophic aspirations, but their use of the history of philosophy in furthering their metaphilosophical project. Each constructs a history of the discipline to further his case. In this regard, to do philosophy historically is to construct what Piercey terms a “philosophical picture”. Every picture tells a story, albeit a different story, about the world seen philosophically. The first three chapters explore the nature of philosophical pictures as Piercey conceives them.

It should be noted from the outset that whatever Piercey conceives doing philosophically historically to be, it must be sharply distinguished from using history to do philosophy in the manner of, e.g., Thomas Kuhn, Michel Foucault, or Ian Hacking. These iconic and influential figures redefined philosophical understanding of a number of key issues from science to the self by detailing how over time certain accounts come to be viewed as natural and necessary when historical examination sustains no claims to naturalness or necessity. Each in his own way undoes the seeming grip received views exercise by reviewing the history in a particular way. No, the news that Piercey means to convey cannot reasonably be thought to be that history can be used to reveal contingencies in realms where natural necessities were thought to hold sway.

A more plausible attribution would be the view that, when doing philosophy historically, disputes about its history turn out to be like disputes in the history and philosophy of science between, e.g., Kuhn and Lakatos. That is, the telling of the history already reflects a philosophical position, and so which history one tells not only portrays the position but also in important respects simultaneously rationalizes as well the philosophical lessons of history so told. The conflict in such cases is meta-historical, i.e., a debate about which narrative structure to use to explain how we find ourselves where we are. The differences are not only differences in causal structure (e.g., why change occurs), but also differences in assessing outcomes (e.g., did progress occur or not?).

If this were correct, then one might expect that to characterize philosophy done historically would consist in looking at the historiographical debates. Thus my allusion at the outset to issues specific to philosophy of history, issues that are closely tied, in turn, to the varieties and vagaries of narrative structures and the uses, in Louis Mink’s phrase, of narrative form as a cognitive instrument. Indeed, and considering just the figures that Piercey chooses to discuss, there exist debates on these topics between, e.g., MacIntyre and Rorty. In addition, Ricoeur devotes a considerable portion of Volume I of Time and Narrative to discussing just such debates in the philosophy of history, including those within the analytic tradition. But no account of these debates, or any sign of the related literature, appears in Piercey.

Rather, Piercey approaches the topic of philosophical pictures by striving to locate them as an even more general habit of thinking than the notions of a paradigm, an episteme, or a style of reasoning offer. Presumably this greater generality of philosophical pictures results from their being philosophical pictures. As Sellars famously remarks, “The aim of philosophy, abstractly formulated, is to understand how things in the broadest possible sense of the term hang together in the broadest possible sense of the term.”1 Different pictures, Piercey maintains, portray different things and different ways of hanging together. One of Piercey’s recurrent examples of a philosophical picture is Cartesianism, characterized as "injunctions to seek explanation of a certain kind" (26). Pictures determine how a philosophical account might be mounted, though the details may vary. In this respect, Descartes and Husserl both count as philosophers working within a Cartesian picture, whatever the differences of detail between them.

Piercey insists that pictures so conceived cannot be construed as arguments in any conventional sense. They mean to rationally persuade nonetheless. But how? Pictures, he tells us, typically possess a narrative structure, and so result in seeing the (philosophical) world in a new way: "This change in outlook is not like learning a new fact. It is more like undergoing a Gestalt switch… . What we see has not changed. What has changed is what we see it as" (38-9). Note here the distinction Piercey invokes between the unchanging and the changed. A reality remains under the possible flux of pictures. This distinction runs at all levels throughout his accounts. I return to this point below.

Piercey suggests three criteria for answering the question of what makes a narrative structure rationally acceptable or compelling:

First, does this enterprise have a goal the achievement of which would make it successful? Second, does it have systematic methods that it uses to pursue this goal? And third, does it have characteristic values it tries to maximize in the course of pursing its goal? (50)

Consider how he answers his first question:

We know what it would take for someone to succeed at this enterprise [of doing philosophy historically] … namely, books such as Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature, books that manage to change our way of looking at the philosophers of the past. So this enterprise not only has clear standards of success; its practitioners meet these standards. (ibid.)

Now, unabashed fan and admirer though I am of Rorty’s work, I have also read the reviews and heard the reactions to his book and related writings. Who is this “we” of whom Piercey speaks? For those who find the proclamations of self-evidence convincing here, Piercey yields no gain in insight regarding how one comes to know this (unless one finds appeals to “seeing as” revelatory in this regard). Conversely, for those who did not rush to embrace Rorty’s book, nothing Piercey says will be a reason for them to alter their opinion either.

What other guidance does Piercey proffer to those perplexed by what he takes doing philosophy historically to be?

What about the demand that rational enterprises follow methods? … [Those who do philosophy historically] construct narratives, and more specifically, narratives that aim to trigger a certain kind of ‘seeing as’ in their audience. This is not to say that all attempts to do philosophy historically follow a single pattern. There are different ways of … constructing narratives about past thought. The point is simply that in doing philosophy historically, we do not proceed by happenstance. We use systematic methods, though these methods leave us some latitude in how we use them. (51)

So, since not happenstance, therefore a necessary condition for rationality has been satisfied. But what establishes that it is not happenstance? Piercey does not say, although perhaps he means to suggest that if your audience remains unconvinced, if their gestalt does not switch, then the methods have not been followed. But the foregoing paragraph contains as much as Piercey provides about specific methods.

Recall that Kuhn uses the “Gestalt switch” analogy to illustrate what happens when theoretical allegiances change despite an absence of purely rational considerations to motivate such a shift. How then does Piercey contribute to understanding the rationality of doing philosophy historically by invoking this notion? Unfortunately, Piercey’s unexplicated appeals to “seeing as” or “Gestalt shifts” assume the full explanatory burden in the name of rationality. Thus, the relevant notion of method remains quite mysterious.

The final criterion of the rationality of the procedure concerns values:

It might not be possible to give a complete list of these values, but we can, I think, name a few of the most important ones. One, surely, is historical accuracy. Our narratives about the evolution of philosophical pictures must cohere with the historical record as we understand it, or at least not be wildly inconsistent with it. (51)

Here, as in other places, Piercey’s unwitting reliance on a scheme-content dichotomy rears it ugly head. For how can pictures both constitute an interpretive frame and yet also be judged by some alternative standard of accuracy? Piercey’s discussion of truth only complicates an account made murky from lack of any real details and prima facie inconsistent appeals to pictures as constituting frames and pictures as judged from within a frame.

Piercey provides no escape from such puzzles when he counsels that “the claim that truth is identical with correctness does not seem intelligible on its own” (56). What else does truth require? He states: “We could not make correct assertions about the way things really are if things did not present themselves as being a certain way” (ibid.). Of course, to “present themselves as being a certain way” they must be part of some picture. So, following the line that Piercey favors, truth consists in a disclosive event (see, e.g., 54). Leaving aside questions of how to understand the givenness of disclosure, a puzzle remains regarding how to interpret the aforementioned emphasis on conditions of accuracy. Compounding this reader’s puzzlement, Piercey maintains, on Heidegger’s behalf, that historical accuracy is not a necessary condition for providing an exemplary instance of doing philosophy historically. “Heiddegger”, Piercey writes in defense of Heidegger’s (mis)reading of Plato, “is engaged in a very different enterprise than traditional Plato scholarship, so he should not be held to its standards” (144). Now it might be said that what Heidegger holds up to criticism is Platonism, and that at issue here is Platonism qua philosophical picture. But, Piercey’s readers have also been told, there is no one way of portraying a picture. Making sense of all this is left as an exercise for the reader.

Piercey’s advocated method stands in opposition to what he says about it:

To do philosophy historically would be to import the genetic method into philosophy. What would this involve? … It would be to maintain that this object, like a seed or a human society, is the sort of thing the nature of which is to develop. It would be to claim that the object in question is an interaction of active and passive powers. (19)

But if all one has is pictures, then even putative philosophical objects — Platonism, Cartesianism — come to be by virtue of thinking aggregating things in certain ways. In this key respect, pictures create the objects they purport also to examine. In addition, Piercey also employs a scheme-content dichotomy that, by his own account of pictures, he should reject. Instead, he appeals to an independent notion of content as a constraint on philosophical pictures:

The number of categories to which the figure belongs may be quite large — perhaps indefinitely large — but it is not unlimited. Seen in this light, doing philosophy historically is not an exercise in pure rhetoric or unbridled persuasion. It cannot convince us of absolutely anything. It is constrained by evidence. The evidence about what a thing is constrains what that thing may be seen as. (46)

He say this at the bottom of the very same page at the midpoint of which he states, "The narratives we construct while doing philosophy historically … lead us to see certain figures and texts as instances of a philosophical picture — that is, as being a certain kind of thing (ibid.). Or, again from the same page: “Once we have settled on a scheme, however, certain claims about the history of thought are ruled out as just wrong” (ibid.). Either pictures categorize objects or they do not. If they do, pictures (like Kuhnian paradigms) also determine the relevant notion of evidence. Pictures make it possible for there to be something rather than nothing. If evidence is something against which pictures are judged, then I at least can make no sense of what Piercey seems to want to say about the cognitive role of philosophical pictures.

The significance of Piercey’s neglect of the philosophy of history for the project that he sets himself cannot be overstated. The 1972 publication of Hayden White’s Metahistory triggered a discussion of historical narrative that continues to this day. Mink’s landmark analyses of the configurational nature of historical understanding, Frank Ankersmit’s explorations of narratives as pictures, and C.E.G. Lorenz’s application of the notion of internal realism to historical accounts not only anticipate what Piercey tries to articulate regarding philosophical pictures, but also go far beyond anything he offers. This list hardly begins to detail what of interest has been written on these topics. The problem here transcends any tired distinction between “analytic” and “continental” philosophy. Those who works seriously on these topics, and Ricoeur is as good a model as one might like, need to take it upon themselves to have a familiarity with the debate as it has been shaped by philosophical writings over the last several decades. Piercey makes no such effort, and many of the faults his work betrays result from this fact.

1 Wifrid F. Sellars, “Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man”, in W. Sellars, Science, Perception and Reality (New York: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1963), p. 1.