The Value of Emotions for Knowledge

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Laura Candiotto (ed.), The Value of Emotions for Knowledge, Palgrave Macmillan, 2019, 310pp., $109.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783030156664.

Reviewed by Angela Mendelovici, The University of Western Ontario


If we could assign a foil for this volume, it would be the view that takes emotions to be opposed to rationality, a view on which emotions are generally distracting, fact-twisting, misleading, and unreliable, hindering rather than furthering our epistemic goals. Most of the papers in this volume challenge this picture in one way or another. Together, they offer an alternative outlook on which emotions stand to play a multitude of key epistemic roles.

The volume covers many bases, with contributions from a wide range of perspectives, including situated, embodied, pragmatist, and literary perspectives. The volume arguably has something for everyone interested in the topic, though many readers will prefer to pick and choose among the contributions.

The volume is divided into five parts, but, as is often the case in edited volumes, the papers do not fit neatly into the assigned categories. Nonetheless, certain key themes emerge on multiple occasions, including the pervasiveness of emotions in reasoning and cognition (Ramy, Wilkinson et al., Ward), the representational contents of moods and emotions and how they affect their epistemic standing (Berninger, Hatzimoysis, Mun), the epistemic relevance of particular emotions (e.g., Earnshaw on disorientation, Brady on suffering, and Engel on anger and contempt), and the role of embodied, embedded, and situated approaches (Dreon, Wilkinson et al., Mendonça and Sàágua, Candiotto). In what follows, I describe some of the contributions that I found particularly cogent and illuminating.

Anja Berninger's clear, engaging, and well-argued "Group Emotions and Group Epistemology" (Chapter 12) examines, as the title suggests, how group emotions affect group epistemology. For Berninger, an emotion belongs to a group when all members of the group have it or a similar emotion, and are to some degree aware that the other group members do, too. Berninger considers and rejects an account of group emotions that builds on the popular representational view of emotions, the view on which emotions are representations of objects having particular evaluative properties (e.g., a fear of a tiger might be a representation of the tiger as dangerous). On the representational view, a group emotion is a matter of group members representing something as having the same or similar evaluative properties and being to some degree aware that other group members also represent the object in this way.

Berninger has three worries with the representational view: (1) It does not make good sense of emotions' far-reaching effects on cognition (e.g., positive emotions make us more creative and distractible and anger leads to hasty decision-making). (2) It does not explain why emotions that are appropriate to the situation can nonetheless have negative effects on both individual and group epistemic processes (e.g., an intense fear of a tiger, even when the tiger is in fact threatening, might make it more difficult to react appropriately to the impending threat). (3) An approach to group emotions that is based on the representational view leaves out some interesting epistemic features of groups, such as how they collectively engage in epistemic undertakings.

Berninger proposes an alternative way of thinking about emotions, which, she claims, delivers a better account of group emotions and their relation to the epistemic features of groups. On Berninger's proposal, emotions are, at least in part, particular manners of thinking (see also Berninger 2016). For example, fear might partly consist in fast-paced thinking and a narrow scope of attention, while joy might partly consist in fast-paced thinking and a broad scope of attention. On this picture, shared emotions involve a shared manner of thinking -- a shared cognitive outlook -- which might include, among other things, a shared way of allocating attentional resources.

Berninger's proposal highlights important properties that subjects have when they experience emotions. But, arguably, so does the representational account: it highlights representational properties, which, on many versions of the view, are meant to capture the phenomenal character of emotions. Indeed, many would agree that subjects experiencing emotions usually have both sets of properties: functional properties consisting of changes in behavior and cognition as well as phenomenal properties consisting in representing particular contents. What, then, is at stake in the debate between the two accounts? In order for the dispute not to be merely terminological, we need a prior way of fixing reference upon emotions -- a job description or theory-independent characterization -- that we can then measure the competing views up against. Absent this, perhaps the best thing to say is that there are two interesting and usually co-occurring mental phenomena in the area.

Anthony Hatzimoysis' "In Search of the Rationality of Moods" (Chapter 13) argues that there is no good basis on which to ascribe rationality to moods. As he points out, there has been much discussion on whether emotions can be assessed for rationality -- e.g., whether they can be fitting, appropriate, or reasonable -- but little discussion of whether moods can be assessed for rationality. In his paper, Hatzimoysis considers three different views of moods: the view that moods are intentional states, the view that they are "second-order states" whose function is to trigger various cognitive, conative, or other "first-order" intentional states, and his favored view that moods are background feelings. He argues that none of these views can provide a basis on which to ascribe rationality to moods, either because they do not characterize moods in a way that would make them rationally assessable or because they fail for independent reasons.

Hatzimoysis correctly identifies the intentional view of moods as the most promising for those wishing to ascribe rationality to moods. Standards of rationality most clearly apply to intentional states, since these are states that in some sense "say something" and so might be true or false, accurate or inaccurate, or justified or unjustified. He argues against the intentional view by arguing that moods do not have intentional contents, considering and rejecting three candidate views of their contents: the view that moods represent the world as a whole as having particular affective properties (e.g., <the world is scary>), the view that moods represent multiple distinct objects as having particular affective properties (e.g., <the dark alley is scary>, <the street light is scary>, <the noise is scary>, etc.), and, finally, the view that moods represent unbound affective properties (e.g., <scariness>). I, personally, am partial to the third view as a view of at least the phenomenal features of moods (see Mendelovici 2013a, b), since I think it does justice to the phenomenology of moods, which genuinely seem to lack an intentional object but which nonetheless seem phenomenally similar to corresponding emotions that do have intentional objects (e.g., a fearful mood is phenomenally similar to the emotion of fearing a dog).

Hatzimoysis, however, worries that there are conceptual problems with this picture. What, he asks, are these unbound affective properties that moods are supposed to represent? According to the view, affective properties are the properties that emotions ascribe to their objects, the scariness that fear ascribes to dogs, alleys, etc. What it is to represent an unbound affective property is to represent an affective property without attributing it to any particular object. Hatzimoysis' worry with this suggestion is that it is not clear why a mere property "should have any affective significance at all." (p. 288) The idea seems to be that we can represent unbound properties without having a mood, so representing an unbound property cannot be the full correct story of what it is to have a mood. For example, we can represent <cathood> or <blueness> without being in a particular mood. But this worry neglects that, on the view under consideration, moods don't represent any old unbound properties, but unbound affective properties, the very same properties represented by emotions (compare: a representationalist account of color phenomenology explains color phenomenology by the representation of objects as having color properties, not of objects as having any old properties). The claim is that we experience a mood when we represent these properties without representing them as being had by any object.

Does this view help us offer an account of the rationality of moods? Unfortunately for the defender of the rationality of moods, I don't think so. Moods do not represent propositional contents but rather proprietal contents, contents representing ways something can be. So they cannot be true or false, accurate or inaccurate, justified or unjustified, etc. Perhaps, one might suggest, there is an extended sense of "rational" on which moods might be deemed appropriate or inappropriate by some other standard, say, by their being helpful or fulfilling their proper function, but this is a far cry from the kind of rational assessment Hatzimoysis is after and the kind of rational assessment the intentional account seemed to promise. So, ultimately, we should agree with Hatzimoysis' central thesis that moods are beyond the realm of rationality.

Dave Ward's eloquent and insightful "Moving Stories: Agency, Emotion and Practical Rationality" (Chapter 7) argues that emotions play a key role in making us agents, which he understands as subjects who act for reasons rather than being "merely shunted around by external forces" (p. 145). Ward aims to provide an engineering story of agency, a story of how a system that acts for reasons can be constructed. His starting point is David Velleman's (1989, 2006, 2009, 2014) picture on which we have two sorts of self-understanding: (1) a causal-psychological understanding on which we think of ourselves as folk-psychological subjects of beliefs, desires, and other intentional states, and (2) a narrative understanding on which we think of ourselves as protagonists in a story we tell about ourselves. The sort of story involved in narrative understanding differs from a mere description of a sequence of events in that it has an emotional cadence -- it involves a sequence of related emotions that inform our understanding of the constituent events, from the positive or negative emotions surrounding an initial event through to the emotions evoked by the narrative's resolution. These two forms of self-understanding guide our actions. When we are guided by our causal-psychological understanding of ourselves, we aim to conform to the standards of practical rationality. When we are guided by our narrative understanding, we might act in ways that make narrative sense but that are practically irrational -- for example, we might succumb to the sunk cost fallacy, working towards a goal even when the expected utility does not outweigh the expected cost, in order to provide a resolution to the story of our efforts that makes narrative sense. So far, Ward is on board with Velleman's picture.

Ward is also on board with Velleman's "rationalist" account of agency, according to which agency is the drive to act in accordance with the dictates of practical rationality, i.e., the drive to act reasonably. The motivation Ward attributes to Velleman for this view is that, roughly, unlike in the case of other mental states and capacities, we cannot disassociate ourselves, as agents, from our drive to act reasonably. It is part and parcel of our agency.

But while Velleman claims that narrative understanding is built on a prior causal-psychological understanding, Ward proposes a reversal of this order of dependence: He argues that we start off with a primitive capacity for narrative understanding, the kind that is involved in ritualized play events like games of peek-a-boo, which are rendered intelligible to babies via a fit with an emotional cadence -- i.e., with the sequence of emotions that go along with the game. Since we desire intelligibility and approval, we pick up narratives from others in our society, including narratives that exemplify causal-psychological wisdom. We take these narratives to be not just descriptive but also regulative, so we are motivated to conform our behavior to them. In this way, we come to appreciate and be motivated to conform to the standards of practical rationality exemplified by causal-psychological narratives. In short, we acquire the drive to act reasonably, thereby becoming agents.

Following the familiar narrative of a book review, we might ask whether we should believe this story. Recall that Ward's goal is to offer an engineering story of agenthood, a story of "what we need to engineer a system that acts for reasons, rather than one that is merely shunted around by external forces" (p. 145). This story has two parts: One is (or at least can be understood as) a story of the metaphysically sufficient conditions of agency on which agency is identical to one's drive to act reasonably. The other is a developmental story describing how we come to acquire this drive.

The developmental story is quite attractive. The depiction of narrative understanding and the role that emotions play in it is likely to resonate with many readers, and the story of how we get from a primitive capacity for narrative understanding to a motivation to act reasonably, while somewhat speculative, is elegant and compelling (it's a good story, indeed!). What's perhaps most attractive about it is that, according to it, the drive to conform to the standards of practical rationality is not a basic human drive but rather one that is developed out of other preexisting mental states and capacities. This promises to make sense of both the successes and the failures of practical rationality.

But I must confess that I find the first part of the story, the account of the metaphysically sufficient conditions of agency, somewhat confusing. One might wonder what the rules of the game are here -- what is required in order to answer the question of what it is to act out of reasons? One can imagine more or less demanding ways of conceiving of our explanandum. A very undemanding way takes acting out of reasons to be merely a matter of representing reasons and desiring to act in accordance with them. A more demanding way requires that the contents of our reason-representing mental states be causally potent or even that we have some kind of heavy-duty free will. Of course, many questions about reasons will ultimately be answered by a theory of reasons, but absent a clear explanandum, it is unclear how to begin to assess such a theory.

In his clear and crisp paper "What Can Information Encapsulation Tell Us About Emotional Rationality?" (Chapter 3), Raamy Majeed considers Ronald de Sousa's (1987) suggestion that emotions solve the frame problem -- roughly, the problem of deciding what information from one's vast store of information must be considered in generating a response -- by directing our attention to relevant information, which they achieve in part by being informationally encapsulated. Majeed agrees with de Sousa that emotions help to solve the frame problem by directing our attention but argues that informational encapsulation is not necessary for them to play this role. Still, Majeed argues, even though being informationally encapsulated is not necessary for emotions to direct our attention in the relevant way, it can nonetheless help emotions do so by, first, increasing the efficiency of their operation and, second, protecting them from top-down influences, which might inappropriately redirect our attention elsewhere.

Majeed's picture builds on de Sousa's, offering a clear and compelling story of how emotions solve the frame problem by drawing our attention to relevant information. Interestingly, on this picture, emotions are not merely one type of state among many but instead play a pervasive and relatively fundamental role in cognition. Majeed's arguments are clear and largely convincing, though one might wonder whether protecting emotional reactions from top-down influences is really all that desirable when it comes to solving the frame problem. In some cases, such as the case of phobias or implicit biases, protection from top-down influences might cause us to direct our attention in ways that we would all-things-considered deem unhelpful, making salient information that might not be in line with our overall doxastic state. This, of course, does not challenge the claim that emotions help solve the frame problem in the way that Majeed proposes but only that protection from top-down influences helps emotions solve the frame problem successfully, directing us to the information that is relevant by the subject's own lights.

Another contribution that attributes to emotions a pervasive and relatively fundamental role is Sam Wilkinson, George Deane, Kathryn Nave, and Andy Clark's "Getting Warmer: Predictive Processing and the Nature of Emotion" (Chapter 5). This paper is an advertisement for a picture of emotions based on the predictive processing framework. According to the predictive processing framework, cognition is a matter of comparing incoming sensory information to top-down predictions about the world. The nervous system aims to minimize the discrepancy between incoming information and predictions, responding to such predictive error either by changing its predictive model or bringing the world in line with the model through bodily action (see, e.g., Clark 2013 for an overview).

Wilkinson et al.'s proposal concerning emotions combines multiple ideas: First is the claim that emotions arise as the result of the integration of interoceptive and other sensory signals and top-down predictions -- a roughly Jamesian (1884) picture, but with, as Wilkinson et al. describe it, a "predictive twist" (p. 103). Second is the claim that the valence of an emotion -- its positive or negative evaluative dimension -- is a matter of the rate at which prediction error is reduced, with positive valence corresponding to a rate of error reduction that is higher than expected and negative valence corresponding to a rate that is lower than expected. On this picture, valence emerges not only when it comes to interoceptive predictions but throughout cognition as a whole. Third is the claim that there is no sharp divide between belief-like states and motivation-like states. On the proposed picture, all we have is prediction of sensory signals based on pre-existing models. When these predictions are about the world, we are moved to reduce prediction error by altering our model; these are beliefs. When these predictions are about our own future actions and states, we are moved to reduce predictive error through action; these are desires. But there is a continuum of cases, each with both a belief-like and a motivation-like aspect. Where do emotions fit in? They lie somewhere in the middle of the continuum, telling us how the world is and directing us to act at the same time, much like Ruth Millikan's (1995) "pushmi-pullyu" representations. On this picture, then, emotions are not only pervasive but also continuous with other cognitive states.

The paper paints a bold and ambitious picture of the mind, one that gives emotions a key role in cognition. We can think of this overall picture as being factorable into two key components: first, a particular version of the predictive processing story of cognitive processing and, second, an identification of personal-level mental states -- e.g., the thoughts, perceptual states, and emotions that we experience -- with different kinds of states in the processing story. While the first part of the story might be supported by the kinds of empirical evidence and theoretical considerations relevant to claims about cognitive processing, the second is arguably answerable to a rather different set of empirical and theoretical considerations, including considerations from introspective judgment and the kinds of metaphysical considerations that are sometimes invoked in discussions of theories of consciousness and intentionality. While the two parts of the story are certainly related, it is possible to be cautiously optimistic about the first -- the processing story -- while remaining skeptical of the second.

In conclusion, the volume contains many rich and interesting papers centred on the epistemic relevance of emotions. Through its contributions, it succeeds in illustrating the richness and diversity of the space of theoretical options for ascribing to emotion a role in reason.


Thanks to David Bourget for comments on an earlier draft.


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